G. E. Moore: Early Philosophical Writings

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G. E. Moore, G. E. Moore: Early Philosophical Writings, Cambridge University Press, Thomas Baldwin and Consuelo Preti (eds.), 2011, lxxxv+251pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521190145.

Reviewed by Bart Schultz, University of Chicago


More by G. E. Moore may turn out to be less. That is surely an obvious snarky crack to make about a work that presents Moore's very early gropings, as a young scholar at Cambridge University, toward the theory later canonized in his Principia Ethica (1903). The publication of this "juvenilia" was long opposed by Moore's son and literary executor, Timothy Moore, who did not believe that it would enhance his father's posthumous reputation. But Timothy Moore having passed from this world, editors Thomas Baldwin and Consuelo Preti saw an opportunity to bring forth into the light -- with the consent of Moore's grandson, Peregrine Moore -- Moore's (unsuccessful) fellowship dissertation of 1897, with the reports on it by the examiners Henry Sidgwick and Edward Caird, and his (successful) fellowship dissertation of 1898, with the examiner's report on it by Bernard Bosanquet. The result, it is safe to say, is a handsomely produced work for a small band of specialists and enthusiasts.

The obvious crack out of the way, it must be said that the specialists and enthusiasts (and one hopes others as well) ought to find this is an excellent and most welcome work. It is hard to slight the editors, both thoroughly expert on the philosophy of G. E. Moore, for wanting a fuller public record of the early writings that would in due course bear such remarkable fruit. Moore had a genuinely profound impact both on English language academic philosophy, not least through his association with and influence on Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein, and on the larger cultural scene, famously, the Bloomsbury set, many members of which, notably Lytton Strachey and John Maynard Keynes, treated Moore as a secular saint with the last word on the Good. Moore, like Sidgwick before him, was one of the leading Cambridge Apostles, and like so many members of that not-so-secret secret discussion society, a considerable influence behind the scenes as well as on the stage.

The particular historical moment captured in these early writings was critical. As the editors explain in their lengthy and extremely valuable introduction:

the value of this work lies in the ways in which, starting from the idealist standpoint of the 1897 dissertation, he [Moore] thinks his way, via the 1898 dissertation, to the analytical realism of Principia Ethica and 'The Refutation of Idealism'. Moore himself, once immersed in his distinctive analysis of common sense, did not recognize his own achievement; but in the context of contemporary inquiries into the origins of analytic philosophy, the contribution made by Moore's early work is obvious. (p. xxii)

Moore's Principia Ethica is of course famous for claiming that questions about what one ought to do are questions about how to promote the good, with good being a simple non-natural property and indefinable, like yellow.

'Good,' then, if we mean by it that quality which we assert to belong to a thing, when we say that the thing is good, is incapable of any definition, in the most important sense of that word. The most important sense of 'definition' is that in which a definition states what are the parts which invariably compose a certain whole, and in this sense 'good' has no definition because it is simple and has no parts. (Moore 1903, p. 61)

To attempt to explicate or analyze goodness in other terms, whether natural or metaphysical, is to commit the "naturalistic fallacy," confusing the "is" of attribution with the "is" of identity, since it is always an open question (not a mere tautology) whether pleasure, say, or some other property, really is intrinsically good. It is a common mistake to reduce "all propositions to the type of those which assert either that something exists or that something which exists has a certain attribute (which means, that both exist in a certain relation to one another)" (Moore 1903, p. 176). Of course, one can investigate which things do, as complex wholes, possess pre-eminent goodness, which can vary in degree, though according to Moore's principle of organic unity, the value of a whole may not be the mere sum of the value of the parts. The method for assessing the intrinsic goodness of something, apart from its consequences, is, on this account, to ask if it would be good in complete isolation, a test that is met by friendship or affectionate relationships and the contemplation of beauty. Indeed, for Moore, a beautiful universe would clearly be good and an ugly one bad even if there were no conscious creatures around to appreciate either one as such.

What is more, rational egoism is incoherent because the notion of "own good" or "personal good" is incoherent:

The only reason I can have for aiming at 'my own good,' is that it is good absolutely that what I so call should belong to me -- good absolutely that I should have something, which if I have it, others cannot have. But if it is good absolutely that I should have it, then everyone else has as much reason for aiming at my having it, as I have myself. (Moore 1903, p. 150)

Many of these claims can indeed be seen brewing in these early writings. In fact, this work also provides the backstory for Moore's most important pre-Principia effort, the 1898 "Elements of Ethics" lectures that he delivered at the London School of Ethics and Social Philosophy, a short-lived adult education venture launched at the Passmore Edwards (later Mary Ward) Settlement by Sidgwick and Bosanquet. These lectures were edited and published -- with Timothy Moore's consent -- by Tom Regan in 1991. As Regan explained, in his introduction to that work, "much of the basic metaphysical and epistemological framework that undergirds Moore's ethical teachings in Principia already is in place in The Elements" (Regan 1991, p. xxx). On that framework, Regan continues:

There exists a world of individual things (table and chairs, minds and their contents, for example). These things are all in time, and some are in space as well. They are constituted by those natural properties that together make them what they are. There is no substantial 'something I know not what' in which these properties subsist, the natural properties are themselves substantial.

In addition to the world of particular things in space or time, Moore recognizes a second, radically different order of being. The denizens of this world are not individual things but concepts or universal meanings (for example, yellowness, not this or that yellow thing). These concepts are not in space or time, do not come into being and pass away, and are not subject to qualitative change. Moreover, 'of all concepts,' Moore writes in The Elements (Lecture V), 'it is true that they are whether they exist or no.' Since this is true of all concepts, it is true of the concept Good. (Regan 1991, pp. xxxi-xxxii)

This Platonic realism -- which in The Elements was more readily acknowledged as Platonic -- is clearly crucial to understanding a key claim of the Principia: "For what Moore means when he claims that 'Good is indefinable' is barely distinguishable (if distinguishable at all) from what Plato would mean if he said 'the Form (or Idea) of Good is indefinable'" (Regan 1991, p. xxxii). The Moorean obsession with concepts, beyond mere verbal definitions, would prove enduring.

But the road to that Platonic realism is scarcely given in The Elements. Rather, its outlines are uncovered in the work at hand, more particularly in the transition from the 1897 dissertation to the 1898 one. Although much of the former was in fact rolled into the latter, with long parts being devoted to the interpretation of Kant on freedom, the metaphysical core was quite different, marking a decisive break from the Absolute idealism of Bradley. At one level, this is, of course, part of the general lore about the origins of analytic philosophy: Moore, with Russell following him, breaking free of the various idealisms, Bradley's and McTaggart's especially, that had bewitched them into denying the reality of time, relations, etc. But the devilish details are very important and complex, and many going accounts of the early Moore get things wrong. As Baldwin and Preti describe it:

Moore cites Bradley -- and no one else -- as an influence in the preface to his 1897 dissertation . . . But the story here is not simply one of the dominant influence of idealist philosophy on Russell and Moore. Idealist philosophy itself was not a unified doctrine, and an important aspect of Moore's acknowledgement to Bradley is that he credits Bradley's metaphysics with preventing him from accepting Caird's neo-Kantian idealism. Thus at this stage Bradley's Absolute, which transcends not only our own consciousness, but consciousness generally, provided Moore with a way of avoiding the subjective idealism that he held had infected Kant's ethics and metaphysics. Furthermore, a fuller picture of the rise of analytic philosophy will link Moore's early philosophical development to other intellectual developments in the late nineteenth century, in particular to the rise of 'mental science', i.e. scientific psychology. For an important aspect of the way in which Moore became equipped to distance himself from his early embrace of Bradley's idealism in 1897 to the realism at the core of his 1898 dissertation is to be found in his reaction to this newly emerging field of scientific psychology. Finally, it is also important to take account of the influence on Moore's still developing ethical theory of his teacher, Henry Sidgwick, who remained a powerful critic of idealist ethics. (p. xxiv)

The editors are to be especially commended for their recognition of the importance of Sidgwick in this story, since his role is often neglected in work on the origins of analytical philosophy (for example, in Scott Soames's Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century [2003]). Sidgwick emerges, true to form, as eminently reasonable and sane, bringing to Moore's work some of the same wicked humor that he had brought to McTaggart's (successful) prize dissertation: "I can see that this is nonsense, but what I want to know is whether it is the right kind of nonsense." Sidgwick was impressed with Moore's critical acumen and dialectical vigor, but thought the 1897 dissertation longer on promise than on performance. It was also true, as the editors observe, that Moore had another chance at the prize fellowship, whereas other candidates in 1897 did not. And in 1898, Sidgwick took the trouble to caution James Ward, who had replaced him as a fellowship elector, not to ruin Moore's chances "by failing to speak sufficiently favourably" of his work (xiii).

Ward apparently followed Sidgwick's advice. He must have (though his actual written report is missing) in order to overcome Bosanquet's quite negative report on Moore's effort. But as it transpires, he was apparently not much happier with Moore than Sidgwick or Bosanquet were, deeming him too skeptical. Indeed, it is striking that none of the assessments of Moore's dissertations was thoroughly positive, and all echoed the same themes about his being a philosopher of ability, promise, and acumen, whose best work was yet to come.

Caird's report was the most positive, urging that "Mr. Moore shows himself to be a thinker of no ordinary power, and that he has established his claim to any reward that is given for such work." But this is in the context of developing some very informed criticisms of Moore's reading of Kant, which is crucial to both the dissertations. Moore, Caird judges, "is extremely difficult to understand," and this is in part because

Kant is read so much through the eyes of Bradley and Lotze, which leads . . . to an imperfect realization of the best points in Kant's work, and an exaggeration of his inconsistencies. Sometimes it is not quite easy to see whether Mr. Moore is interpreting Kant, or expressing his own views. (p. 99)

This last charge had often been made against Caird himself.

Bosanquet, commenting on the 1898 dissertation, was harsher:

To make my meaning clear, I ought to add that I do not complain of the rejection of the Free Will of Indifference, either in itself, or as ascribed to Kant, and the writer's defence against objections based on moral responsibility seems to me successful. But I do think it a serious matter that views should be adopted by an interpreter of Kant which wholly preclude him from giving a positive significance to the idea of Freedom which underlies Kant's whole philosophy. (p. 248)

Had Moore submitted his piece to Bosanquet as an editor of Mind, Bosanquet

should have treated it respectfully as a brilliant essay by a very able writer, but should have endeavoured to point out that its positive stand-point and consequently its treatment of the subject were hopelessly inadequate, that is to say that the writer was not successful, to any appreciable extent, in representing the real nature and interconnection of the factors involved in the problem with which he was concerned. (pp. 248-49)

Ironically, a large chunk of the 1898 dissertation is missing from the manuscript copy, and this, the editors plausibly surmise, must have been because Moore used it in assembling his essay on "The Nature of Judgement," which duly appeared in Mind in 1899 and is used here, in part, to fill in the gap. Another piece pulled straight from the (more Bradleyan) critique of Kant in the 1897 dissertation, "Freedom," had appeared in Mind the year before. One of Moore's Cambridge teachers, G. F. Stout, not Bosanquet, was the editor of Mind during this period, and Moore would succeed him in 1921, a couple of years before Bosanquet's death.

At any rate, that Moore was not a compelling interpreter of Kant was a point also put, more laconically, by Sidgwick in his earlier report:

The criticism of the special notion of Freedom, fundamentally important in Kant's system appears to me of less value than it might have been, because his [Moore's] examination of the passages in Kant's sections in which this notion is expounded and applied, is somewhat defective in completeness and in method. (p. 97)

This, too, is somewhat ironic, given that Moore was largely following out lines of criticism of Kant to be found in Sidgwick. As Moore puts it:

Kant's inconsistency lies, then, in the first place, rather in the fact that he does not hold good and evil actions to be equally results of Transcendental Freedom. The doctrine that they are so, would have resulted from the general account . . . of what such Freedom must be held to be. And in holding this doctrine, he would not have been committed to 'Capricious Freedom'. For 'Capricious Freedom' is directly contradictory to Determinism, whereas 'Transcendental Freedom' [is not], since in it the free cause is not a cause in the natural sense, but something partaking at least as much of the nature of a reason. (p. 207)

But then

the whole construction of Kantian Freedom seems finally to fall to the ground. Transcendental Freedom, upon which the main stress of the theory lies, is possible, as a chimaera is possible, but in no other sense. There is no ground for asserting the existence of anything timeless, but it is not contradictory to natural laws to suppose it. Secondly, if any such timeless existence is asserted, it cannot, without contradiction, be supposed to have any closer connection with the human will, than with any other phenomenon. And finally, neither the moral principle itself, nor action in accordance with it, can be taken in any way to prove or to depend upon any other than the Deterministic way of regarding human action; but the basis of Ethics is not thereby, as he thought, endangered. (pp. 209-10)

Apart from a bit of exegetical, textual difference, a big part of Moore's argumentative line here comes around to what is in substance the very position that Sidgwick had long defended in his The Methods of Ethics (first edition 1874). And it is the very view that Rawls himself would later address in A Theory of Justice:

Kant never explains why the scoundrel does not express in a bad life his characteristic and freely chosen selfhood in the same way that a saint expresses his characteristic and freely chosen selfhood in a good one. Sidgwick's objection is decisive, I think, as long as one assumes, as Kant's exposition may seem to allow, both that the noumenal self can choose any consistent set of principles and that acting from such principles, whatever they are, is sufficient to express one's choice as that of a free and equal rational being. Kant's reply must be that though acting on any consistent set of principles could be the outcome of a decision on the part of the noumenal self, not all such action by the phenomenal self expressed this decision as that of a free and equal rational being. Thus if a person realized his true self by expressing it in his actions, and if he desires above all else to realize this self, then he will choose to act from principles that manifest his nature as a free and equal rational being. The missing part of the argument concerns the concept of expression. Kant did not show that acting from the moral law expresses our nature in identifiable ways that acting from contrary principles does not. (Rawls, p. 224)

Interestingly, Caird, in his report, had also suggested some strategies for repairing Kantianism on this count. For Caird,

I never seek to gratify my desires, but always to gratify myself. I always act sub ratione boni, and therefore in all I do, I am in some way determined by the idea of the whole, which is the counterpart of the self. I am free however, in the highest sense, only in so far as I have organized my conflicting desires by this idea which is always involved in them; just as I know in the highest sense, only when I have recognized the unity that underlies all my experience, and have re-organised my knowledge in view of it. Mr. Moore . . . quite rightly argues that no such transformation, or reconstruction, of our motives could come out of the abstract idea of self-consistency, which seems to be all that is expressed in Kant's first formula for the moral law. But Kant reinterprets this formula as equivalent to consistency with the ideas of the self, and of a kingdom of ends; and this shows that he is trying to express the idea of the whole, as involved in the consciousness of self, though continually checked by his view of self consciousness as analytic. Agreement of will with its own nature as rational is, if it be taken in this sense, not an empty idea, but one which is capable of being used as a principle to reorganize our desires; and which in fact, always does in a rational being enter into the constitution of them. (p. 111)

Caird, it should be explained, was probably more knowledgeable about Kant than any other English philosopher of this period, underrated though he may be today. The above statement reflects the very detailed and original interpretation of the Kantian philosophy given in such works as The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, an interpretation that made Kant sound distinctly Hegelian. As W. J. Mander has observed, while

most commentators present Hegel as offering fundamental correctives to the Kantian system, Caird's Kant seems so prescient of the future direction of philosophical thought that poor Hegel is portrayed as offering little more than confirmation or clear expression of the modifications and developments that Kant himself was in the process of making. (Mander 2011, p. 57).

The idealist T. H. Green -- like Caird, a leading influence on Bosanquet -- found Caird's Kant much more congenial than the original, particularly with its emphasis on the transition from empty formalism and the individual to a truly social self-consciousness. Hence, Caird's appeal to the Kingdom of Ends.

But such charity (if it is that) in the interpretation of Kant is scarcely something that either of Moore's dissertations manifests, despite his denials. If, as the editors explain, he resisted Caird's way, in 1897, and "is critical of Kant's conception of things-in-themselves, he does not in the end reject the thesis that appearances are grounded in an all-embracing timeless reality." That is, "Moore uses Bradley's absolute idealism to correct what he takes to be mistakes in Kant's position in this respect" -- an idealism that was at a far remove even from Hegel. But in 1898, "although Moore still affirms the unreality of time, he now questions the existence of any such reality" (p. xlviii).

Thus, the 1897 dissertation shows Moore resisting Caird's views in the name of Bradleyan possibilities, but as Moore approximated his Platonic realism, the warping of his take on Kant grew all the more intense, ending in a profoundly contorted reading that had him in effect reversing Kant's claims about the priority of the Right over the Good and rejecting most of the distinctive features of Kantianism. Moore can make no sense of Kantian pure practical reason, of constructivism, of Kantian freedom, of any transcendental argument, or of anything that does not take as basic a Platonic priority of the good, intuitively grasped. Thus, in a passage the editors highlight:

To call an ethical principle 'rational' will therefore mean, in the first place, that it is a proposition. The question of its origin, whether it be regarded as a precept of Reason, as innate, or derived from experience, must in any case be wholly irrelevant. For such explanations can, at best, only give a history of how we come to apprehend it, of our knowledge of it: itself can not properly be said to have any origin at all. Nevertheless it may be well to state that the description of it as intuitively known seems nearest to the truth; for, whether it be inferred or immediately apprehended, it is, in either case, itself merely 'given', as much as any so-called sense-datum. (p. lvi)

And it is in the 1898 dissertation, not the 1897 one, that Moore frames his famous claim about the indefinability of good, attributing this view to Sidgwick just as he would do in Principia Ethica. As the editors note (p. xxxviii), although Moore was right to credit Sidgwick with avoiding any naturalistic fallacy, he was curiously mistaken in his characterization of Sidgwick's views, since Sidgwick took the fundamental and indefinable normative notion to be ought or right, rather than good. In this, Sidgwick was closer to Kant, and the idea that good should be defined in terms of ought. And Moore, from this perspective, appears to be failing to follow his own advice with respect to good, rendering ought claims as nothing more than concealed tautologies. As Parfit puts it, "Everyone would always do what would make things go best if everyone always did what would make things go best" (Parfit 2011, p. 247).

At any rate, it is perhaps understandable why Bosanquet conceived at this time what would prove to be a bitter, lifelong hostility to Moore's work, a hostility that the editors do not quite capture. For the rest of his life, Bosanquet would identify Moore's chief claim as the indefinability thesis and blast him for harboring a "manifestly false" theory of definition that arbitrarily disposed of all idealist approaches to the subject of relations (see Mander 2011, p. 480).

And it is also clear enough, in retrospect, that the views that won the day were not victorious by sheer force of argument. Moore's work, early or late, did not in any straightforwardly reasonable way get the better of the positions of Sidgwick, Caird, Bradley, or Bosanquet (see, e.g., Dunham, Grant, and Watson 2011). But he did establish a most unfortunate way of approaching the history of philosophy. To concede, as the editors do, that Moore was no Gadamer when it came to the possibility of learning from the past (p. li) scarcely captures the point. As Thomas Hurka has illustrated the issue:

Sidgwick had said that since Bentham's equating of 'good' with 'pleasant' would turn the hedonist 'pleasure is good' into a tautology, Bentham ought to be read in some more charitable way. Moore pounded away at the error relentlessly. Sidgwick's attitude was, 'That would be stupid, therefore Bentham didn't really mean it'; Moore's was, 'Bentham meant it, therefore he really was stupid.' (Hurka 2011, pp. 12-13).

Perhaps G. E. Moore: Early Philosophical Writings is valuable in part for vividly illustrating many of the ways in which philosophy does not, alas, make progress.



Dunham, J., Grant, I. H., and Watson, S, Idealism: The History of a Philosophy (Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press, 2011.

Hurka, Thomas, ed., Underivative Duty: British Moral Philosophers from Sidgwick to Ewing (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011).

Mander, W. J., British Idealism: A History (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011).

Moore, G. E., Principia Ethica, ed. T. Baldwin (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1903/1993).

-- - The Elements of Ethics, ed. T. Regan (Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1991).

Parfit, Derek, On What Matters, two vols. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011).

Rawls, John, A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, MA: the Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1971).

Soames, Scott, Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century: The Dawn of Analysis (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2003).