Reason After Its Eclipse: On Late Critical Theory

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Martin Jay, Reason After Its Eclipse: On Late Critical Theory, University of Wisconsin Press, 2016, 245pp, $44.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780299306502.

Reviewed by Maeve Cooke, University College Dublin


Reason After Its Eclipse tells the long history of thinking about reason. Its narrative is explicitly selective and incomplete, oriented by the concerns of Critical Theory in the Frankfurt School tradition, from Horkheimer, Adorno and Marcuse to Habermas and his critics. But it is by no means a book just for an insider group of Frankfurt School pundits and aficionados. It speaks to anyone concerned with the question of critique, be it in the more general sense, familiar from Kant's critical philosophy, of unflinching scrutiny of dogmatic assertions and authoritarian directives, or in the narrower sense of social criticism. For, evidently, critique presupposes a concept of reason of some kind. To be sure, since interrogation of the rational status of its critical diagnoses and pronouncements has been part of Frankfurt School Critical Theory from the beginning, the book will have a special resonance for those working in or on this tradition of theorizing. In light of its strong association with Hegelian-Marxian thinking, it is worth noting that, in this respect, Critical Theory takes its lead from Kant. As Martin Jay reminds us, Kant conceived of reason as both the organon and target of critique, "both the source of critique and its object, both the wound and its cure". (161)

If, as Walter Benjamin suggests, secular angels have a place in Critical Theory, Jay may well be one of the host. He flies swiftly and gracefully over two millennia of ("Western") human history, touching the ground lightly but sure-footedly at just the right moments. One of these is the moment of fissure between mythos and logos, when reason makes its entrance onto the stage of human history. For some, it enters as a self-sufficient entity, for others it is accompanied by an entourage of "others" -- myths, social customs, emotions, the body, the feminine, even nature itself. Another significant moment is the European Enlightenment, when the perennial struggle to emancipate logos from mythos leads to an exuberant exaltation of reason over its "others". Yet another occurs in the 19th century, when the pendulum predictably swings in the opposite direction. Now, confidence in reason is eroded and Lebensphilosophie and positivist science emerge as two very different responses to this loss of confidence. In general, Jay is attentive to the historical moments when reason comes into crisis, either from internal or external pressures, and is in need of a self-conscious defense. His angel wings envelope a vast expanse of literature, distilling it into a succinct, elegant and informative history, always with an eye to the question of how to harness the critical functions of reason for the purposes of social critique. In the course of his flight, the tips of his wings produce numerous crystals in the form of endnotes; these testify not just to Jay's exceptional erudition but also to an impressive knowledge of publications by recent contributors to contemporary Critical Theory debates.

The title, of course, employs a different celestial image. Not angels but the sun is the book's dominant metaphor. We are told in the opening lines: "Helios, the Titan god; Apollo, his Olympian counterpart; and Sol, their Roman equivalent, all came to represent not only the sun but also in varying degrees something called 'reason'." (3) With this -- ironically, as Jay notes -- the links between illumination, enlightenment, and rationality were forged in the crucible of mythology. In his terminology the connections between rationality, illumination and enlightenment may be understood noetically, as a matter of direct intuition, whereby truth -- the absolute -- is disclosed, brought to light, made present, independently of the process of reasoning itself. Alternatively, it may be understood dianoetically, as a matter of inference, judgment, justification, discursive argumentation. The history of reason is marked by tensions between these two approaches, tensions apparent in Frankfurt School Critical Theory. Even authors like Adorno and Marcuse, who clearly favour a noetic concept of reason, are alert to its dangers; authors like Habermas, who vigorously reject the noetic version, acknowledge the limitations of their dianoetic approaches. However, these tensions testify to continuing links between reason, illumination and enlightenment. In grappling with the tensions Critical Theorists neither dispute the connections nor lament their loss: at issue is what kind of access to the sun's radiance is available and for whom. By contrast, the "eclipse of reason" refers to a severance of the links: reason no longer illuminates or enlightens, not even indirectly; all access to it is denied. This appears to be Horkheimer's position in his 1947 book Eclipse of Reason and perhaps also in Dialectic of Enlightenment, co-authored with Adorno, which appeared in German in the same year. Certainly, Dialectic of Enlightenment disavows all contemporary conceptions of reason. At most Horkheimer and Adorno concede the possibility of aesthetic experiences of illumination, in which a noetically conceived reason is present momentarily.

With the eclipse of reason Critical Theory is confronted with a genuine and disturbing dilemma. As before it sees its main task as a relentless critique of instrumental rationality (the early Critical Theorists' name for a dominating form of reason that extends into all areas and dimensions of human life). Now, however, it must conduct its critique through appeal to an alternative, emphatic conception of reason, which the theory is unable to articulate. This unhappy situation provides the main motivation for Jay's book. He recounts in the Preface a conversation he had in the 1970s with Friedrich Pollock, the political theorist and colleague of Horkheimer and Adorno, to whom Dialectic of Enlightenment is dedicated. Like many of us who have felt the force of the Frankfurt School critique of instrumental reason, Jay wanted to know the normative alternative against which it is pitted. Pollock's exasperated reply was to gesture towards Eclipse of Reason, "an entire book [devoted] to addressing that question." (x) Jay found this answer unsatisfactory.

His dissatisfaction accounts not only for the present book; it explains his focus on late Critical Theory, in particular on Habermas' concept of communicative rationality and the criticism it has generated. For, Jay presents Habermas as restoring reason after its eclipse. He credits him with successfully reconnecting reason with illumination and enlightenment by way of a reconceptualization that desubstantializes, detranscendentalizes, linguistifies, desublimates, pluralizes, proceduralizes, temporalizes, and offers an "as if" narrative of its foundations. He acknowledges that Habermas' account of communicative reason is far from uncontentious. Over the past forty years, in which Habermas has presented (and further developed), his concept of communicative rationality, the struggle to harness the critical functions of reason for the purposes of social critique has persisted unabated. It continues to provoke "new arguments and counterarguments, some seeking to demolish it and others to defend it on less vulnerable grounds" (160). But he also points out that this is as it should be according to its basic tenets. For, communicative reason "never seeks a steady state of rest and completion, despite the regulative telos of consensus produced by the better argument". (ibid.)

This is an impressively short book. While it has two parts and seven chapters, only one chapter marginally exceeds thirty pages; almost all are under twenty. Part l presents four ages of reason: "From the Greeks to the Enlightenment"; "Kant: Reason as Critique; the Critique of Reason"; "Hegel and Marx"; and "Reason in Crisis". Part II deals in three steps with reason's eclipse and return: "The Critique of Instrumental Reason: Horkheimer, Marcuse, and Adorno"; "Habermas and the Communicative Turn"; and "Habermas and his Critics". While each of the chapters is a tour-de-force, three in particular stand out: the discussions of Kant, of Habermas and of Habermas and his critics. The chapters on Kant and on Habermas draw attention to important continuities between Kant and Critical Theory -- continuities crucial for understanding not only Habermas' theory but also, more surprisingly, Adorno's. These chapters are also pellucid expositions of an extensive corpus of complex ideas; Jay's highly compressed accounts render their complexity more rather than less intelligible. The final chapter on Habermas and his critics is not only a masterful overview of the main lines of criticism provoked by Habermas' project, both from within Critical Theory and from without; it ends with a philosophically substantial and insightful discussion of a question that contemporary Critical Theorists -- and their critics -- tend to evade: how to distinguish a rational reason from an irrational one. This leads Jay onto the difficult terrain of how to conceive of the connection between rationality and truth. Here too he never stumbles.

Readers of this review might be tempted to cherry-pick, selecting the chapters just mentioned as stand-alone discussions of particular authors or questions, leaving the other chapters to one side. This would be their loss. The overriding strength of Jay's book is the breadth and depth of the intellectual history of reason it offers, a history that illuminates Critical Theory's concern to criticize our deeply imperfect societies, and the damaged lives they produce. The purpose of such critique, as Jay points out in his final paragraph, is the imagination of radical alternatives to the flawed status quo -- and, we could add, to explore possibilities for realizing them.

Jay anticipates the objection that there is "something not very reasonable in trying to write a history of reason in all its motley variety, even one confined to what has come to be called the "Western" tradition." (x) He underscores the partiality of his history and its modest aims. This is to be applauded. But applause, too, is due to this excellent book, which enlightens, illuminates and invites further reflection on reason and its critical functions.