Eco-Deconstruction: Derrida and Environmental Philosophy

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Matthias Fritsch, Philippe Lynes, and David Wood (eds.), Eco-Deconstruction: Derrida and Environmental Philosophy, Fordham University Press, 2018, 371pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823279500.

Reviewed by Margret Grebowicz, University of Tyumen


In recent years, many thinkers of the nonhuman have made use of Derrida's ideas, to varying degrees of seriousness and depth; but no concentrated, sustained attempt at taking stock of the importance of Derrida's work for environmental philosophy existed until now. The editors, Matthias Fritsch, Philippe Lynes, and David Wood, explicitly distance this collection from the literature produced on animality in response to Derrida's final writings, focusing instead on the environmental implications of the deconstruction of the metaphysics of presence. Despite the collection's commitment to showcasing conversations and even substantive disagreements among its contributors, it seems motivated by the shared assumption that these implications are deep and wide-ranging. The book will be of particular interest to philosophers concerned with time, holism, ontology, metaethics, law, systematicity, apocalypse, life, human exceptionalism, survival, waste, and what "ecology" means, to name just a few of the central issues.

The editors' introduction suggests that life and evolutionary processes are best approached with the help of the most robust notion of difference and differentiation, a framework that only deconstruction offers. More controversial is their additional proposal that the deconstruction of logocentrism "was perhaps always an eco-deconstruction, one that tracks and reconsiders not only the subject of femininity and animality, but our appropriative mastery and alleged sovereignty over nature" (10). This recalls the response made by Derrida and many scholars of his work to what came to be called the ethical turn in Continental philosophy; they claimed that deconstruction was always motivated by ethical concerns. This collection makes the general case that deconstruction was always eco- (though not necessarily eco-logical) quite convincingly, thus securing a place for Derrida's work -- all the way back to Of Grammatology -- in the present environmental turn.

The introduction also skillfully provides a much-needed overview of Continental environmental philosophy, tracing its "older and different paths" (1) back to nineteenth and early twentieth century philosophy of nature, and focusing on eco-phenomenology and eco-hermeneutics as the primary programs which eco-deconstruction problematizes and/or develops. As they situate deconstruction among the other contemporary discourses which have expanded their respective scopes by adding the eco- prefix, however, the editors also caution against

any impatient totalizing consolidation of [eco-deconstruction as] a new frame of reference. This is one way of explaining how eco-deconstruction is not simply another program or approach alongside those previously mentioned but, among other things, a marker of methodological openness (and caution). (8)

This is a classic deconstructionist move, but it's refreshing today, when the most visible discourses comprising the non-human turn (speculative realism, new materialisms) announce themselves loudly as new and reject most basic tenets of the Continental tradition.

Another collection which came out last year and which might look very similar at first glance, General Ecology: The New Ecological Paradigm (Erich Hörl and James Burton, eds., Bloomsbury 2017), is based on a commitment to ecology. Hörl describes ecology as "a new thinking of togetherness and of a great cooperation of entities and forces, which has begun to be significant for contemporary thought; hence it forces and drives a radically relational onto-epistemological renewal" (3). In significant contrast to this, the present book is not unified by any particular ontological commitment, but features wildly methodologically diverse approaches to a single question, that of Derrida's proper (with all due erasures) place in environmental philosophy. Several authors offer close readings, some in conversation with the tradition (John Lewellyn, Lynes, Vicki Kirby, Fritsch), and others focused on Derrida's texts more narrowly (Michael Marder, Michael Naas). Others explore issues of broader environmental thinking and representation, even something like public engagement and imagination (Wood, Kelly Oliver). Some trouble the most abstract metaphysical questions like scale, time, and complexity (Timothy Clark, Karen Barad, Cary Wolfe), while others focus more on identifiably environmental issues like climate and extinction (Wood, Claire Colebrook), and even on policy (Michael Peterson on nuclear waste disposal, Dawne McCance on water). But each has produced a rigorous reading of Derrida "in our times," making the book's subtitle, Derrida and Environmental Philosophy, a much more accurate description of the project's aims.

Still, Eco-Deconstruction is more suggestive and provocative. By its nature, as the introduction says, eco-deconstruction cannot and does not announce itself as a game-changer. But I believe the book could succeed at being just that, thanks to the high caliber of the chapters, each of which is an exquisite study in itself. What unifies the collection's disparate approaches and sets a unique and innovative tone is its fine editorial vision.

The book has four sections: Diagnosing the Present, Ecologies, Nuclear and Other Biodegradabilities, and Environmental Ethics. They appear quite deliberate, discrete, well-defined, and build on each other. They are not exactly clustered around unifying themes, but instead orient the reader towards what a robust environmental philosophy might do, or how it might develop: beginning with the question of how to diagnose the present, moving into ontology of ecology (with special focus on ecology's relationship to economy), moving further into to the metaphysical underpinnings linking biodegradability, decomposition, disintegration, and disability, and finally landing on the question of what all of this means for ethics. The arc of the four sections building on each other shows that the trajectory by which one arrives at environmental ethics is not random.

The final section's dry title, where so much Anglo-American environmental philosophy begins and ends, is an excellent curatorial decision. Rather than "applying" Derrida to concrete environmental problems and how we should handle them, this section shows that the massive challenge to thinking that is "environment" (i.e. life, organisms, evolution, world) requires revisiting our most cherished concepts, like value, response, vulnerability, and hospitality. Understood as a philosophical endeavor, ethics here becomes fundamentally, originally (again, with all the necessary qualifications) environmental. Much nonhuman turn literature ends up saying things that sound like this, but few projects can actually show it as well as this collection does. Such careful building of a work marks the difference between an edited collection that gets its power from the excellence of its contributors and one that can also boast a mature editorial signature.

Though the collection is not split into themes, were "eco-deconstruction" someday to refer to a program or intellectual "scene" -- distinct from the established themes of the animal and the feminine, from which the editors take distance -- we have here a good introduction to what its main guiding themes would be. Topping the list is how to think about time and world away from the holistic interpretations that have so far underpinned most environmental philosophy. Extensive discussions of temporality, which environmental philosophy often reduces to the problem of obligation to future generations and thus relegates to the ethics space, are artfully woven throughout the book. Futurity gets special attention in Nuclear and Other Biodegradabilities, which grounds it in loss, death, memory, and waste, understood not only ethically but also, and perhaps firstly, metaphysically. Environmental time motivates so many of the chapters (Wood, Ted Toadvine, Barad, Lynes, Colebrook, Peterson) that it could have been the basis of its own collection. Relatedly, exhaustive critiques of "the world" or "a shared world" run through many of the chapters (Toadvine, Clark, Lynes, Wolfe, McCance, Oliver), providing further guidance for a future eco-deconstruction.

Other possible themes include what I will call loosely "loss and what remains/survives," a classic deconstructionist problem-space which reemerges here as newly invigorated by the environmental turn, and a specifically eco- take on what difference (including from oneself) really means for ethics. And finally, one of the book's great strengths is that it explores its own limits. Included are arguments that there are things that Derrida's work cannot quite think, most notably disability/extinction and ecology itself (Colebrook and Marder, respectively). These are central to environmental philosophy. By not shying away from the limitations of Derrida's writings in what is also a celebration and masterful extension of them to the environmental field, this collection performs the methodological openness (and caution) it celebrates. But it also presses the question: what's next?

As it stands, this is, like other excellent edited collections, a small group of top-notch scholars in conversation with each other about a set of texts they know very well. For environmental philosophers who might be interested but not as well-trained in Derrida -- i.e., most of them -- it will be thrilling to witness, but unreasonably difficult to join. Of course, this may be said of many areas of the nonhuman turn. But not all discourses suffer from the same pressures as Derrida studies to become more intelligible to outsiders and demonstrate their relevance to the present. This pressure won't be relieved with the help of more conferences, articles, and books on Derrida and [blank]. Marder writes that "the work of thinking at the antipodes to knowing is more effective than all the rushed 'applications' of what is already known to the emergency at hand" (164). But if thinking at the antipodes to knowing continues to happen only among small groups of specialists, how effective can it ever really be? Effective on what, in which world, according to whom?

One possible direction to take eco-deconstruction would be to explore the aforementioned themes (among others) without anchoring them quite so firmly in the authority of Derrida's texts. In fact, it's arguable that this has to happen in order for the coming eco-deconstruction to have significant impact on environmental philosophy more generally. But if it is true that deconstruction has always been an eco-deconstruction, then environmental philosophy is actually the ideal venue in which to reopen this task. The book is thus a tour-de-force work, a timeless contribution to existing Derrida scholarship, as well as, potentially, a timely intervention, well-positioned to inaugurate new currents in environmental philosophy. It all depends on the follow-up.