Ecological Ethics and the Human Soul: Aquinas, Whitehead, and the Metaphysics of Value

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Francisco J. Benzoni, Ecological Ethics and the Human Soul: Aquinas, Whitehead, and the Metaphysics of Value, University of Notre Dame Press, 2007, 261pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268022051.

Reviewed by Christopher M. Brown, University of Tennessee at Martin


Francisco Benzoni believes that in order to bring about desirable changes in the way we treat and respond to non-human environments, we must change the way we think about God, human beings, and indeed, all of reality. According to an influential theological tradition in the West, God cares for each and every member of the human species for its own sake (and enjoins that we do the same), while God cares for non-rational creatures, not for their own sake, but rather for the sake of some other good, e.g., the perpetuation of the species to which a non-rational creature belongs, or the flourishing of human communities, or the perfection of the universe. Benzoni takes St. Thomas Aquinas to be a good representative of this traditional view concerning God's relation to creatures and he argues, in various ways, that the metaphysical system which supports such attitudes is "philosophically untenable" (p. 73). Furthermore, in his view Aquinas's metaphysic encourages us to be apathetic in the face of our contemporary environmental concerns, since according to Aquinas non-rational creatures do not have moral value and ultimate human destiny involves an escape from the world of material change. Benzoni proposes the metaphysics of Alfred North Whitehead as a viable non-dualistic alternative to a metaphysic of the Thomistic sort. Since "ideas … make a difference in how we live" (p. 2), Benzoni thinks we need an alternative metaphysic such as Whitehead's if human communities are to change the way that they respond to non-human creatures and environments.

Before discussing the body of Benzoni's work, it is important to highlight two assumptions that Benzoni makes. In the introduction, Benzoni seems to define 'a creature's having moral worth' as follows:

(1) A creature x has moral worth if and only if it is rational to treat x as an object of direct moral consideration, i.e., as a moral end in itself (p. 3).

Also important for the over-all argument in Benzoni's work is the following assumption:

(2) A viable ethical theory will treat non-rational creatures as creatures possessing moral worth, unless there is good reason to think rational creatures are fundamentally different from non-rational creatures (where such a difference would explain why rational creatures alone deserve to be treated as objects of moral worth).

Benzoni's book has six chapters. In chapter one, Benzoni argues that the fundamental claims of St. Thomas's meta-ethic, e.g., that every being is good insofar as it has being, and that a being is good to the extent that it perfects itself in accord with its kind, do not by themselves entail that non-rational creatures have moral worth. In chapter two, he argues that Aquinas's eschatology entails that there is a fundamental difference between rational creatures and non-rational creatures, for, with the exception of the heavenly bodies and the mixed bodies that compose the human body, there will be no non-rational creatures in heaven. Furthermore, Aquinas's account of divine providence entails that only rational beings are cared for as ends in themselves. Finally, Benzoni argues that Aquinas's ethical theory -- in both its treatment of natural law and the virtues -- shows that Aquinas's ethics is systematically anthropocentric.

In Benzoni's view, Aquinas's "moral bifurcation" (p. 41) between human beings and non-rational creatures is grounded in Aquinas's conviction that human beings are substances whose substantial forms are subsistent -- able to exist independently of a body -- whereas non-rational creatures are substances whose existence is directly tied to the matter that such forms configure. Chapter three thus examines Aquinas's account of the nature of the human soul as subsistent and the nature of human cognition, while chapter four treats Aquinas's arguments for the subsistence (and therefore incorruptibility) of the human soul.

Benzoni's primary argument in the chapters on Aquinas seems to assume that

(3) Aquinas's anthropocentric moral theory is philosophically justified only if Aquinas can demonstrate that the human soul is a subsistent form, and so immaterial and incorruptible.

But as Benzoni points out, Aquinas's arguments for the immateriality and incorruptibility of the human soul depend upon the following assumption:

(4) Human cognition of universals can only be accomplished by an immaterial power, i.e., a power that does not make use of any physical organ as a material cause.

Benzoni argues that Aquinas's belief in (4) trades on drawing an inference from the representational character of the object of understanding, i.e., universals, to the ontological nature of that by which we grasp universals, i.e., the intelligible species. Benzoni notes that Aquinas never defends the inference from the representational immateriality of universals to the ontological immateriality of the intelligible species; in fact, Aquinas seems to be confusing the way in which an object is represented with the nature of the process that grasps the object that does the representing. So Aquinas's arguments for the immateriality of the human soul fail because they include a premise that confuses two senses of 'immaterial' -- the representational and the ontological.

On Benzoni's reading, Aquinas thinks that material cognition is always cognition of a singular thing, i.e., a material object in its material conditions. Since human beings obviously cognize universals, Aquinas concludes that humans must have a power (and so a soul) that is wholly immaterial. But Benzoni thinks that Aquinas is philosophically justified in making such assumptions only if the distinction between immaterial and material entities is a plausible one. Benzoni himself thinks that the distinction between immaterial and material entities is plausible only if one can show that there are, in fact, immaterial entities. The best hope for Aquinas here, Benzoni thinks, lies with the arguments for the existence of God. According to Benzoni, however, Aquinas's five ways are viciously circular arguments (see below).

So according to Benzoni, Aquinas's account of the human soul is "philosophically untenable" (p. 123), since Aquinas's arguments for the immateriality of the human soul are unsuccessful. Because Aquinas can't justify his belief that the human soul is subsistent, Aquinas's anthropocentric approach to ethics lacks a philosophical justification (see proposition (3) above). Given that Aquinas can't philosophically justify his view that God cares for rational creatures alone for their own sake, his ethical theory is also in trouble (see proposition (2) above).

While chapters one through four of Benzoni's work are primarily deconstructive, the fifth and sixth chapters constitute a constructive project. In chapter five Benzoni offers a reading of Whitehead's metaphysic. According to Whitehead, all creatures have moral value, since all creatures -- to one degree or another -- experience reality and freely respond to that reality as it is experienced. But anything that experiences reality such that it freely decides to respond to it is an object of moral value. Therefore, all creatures are objects of moral value. Now as we move up the "ladder" of created reality according to Whitehead, e.g., from non-living creatures to unconscious living creatures, or from unconscious living creatures to conscious ones, these creatures have greater and greater moral value. So all things are morally valuable, but not all things are equal in moral value.

In chapter six, Benzoni puts a Whitehead-inspired environmental ethic into conversation with the value-theories of two leading environmental ethicists, Holmes Ralston III and J. Baird Callicott. Whitehead's metaphysic -- which entails that all creatures enjoy some degree of subjectivity -- allows Benzoni to split the difference between Ralston's objectivism and Callicott's relativism. The problem with the approaches of both Ralston and Callicott is their shared assumption that non-rational creatures are incapable of subjective experience. Non-rational creatures are, of course, incapable of reflective subjectivity, but in Benzoni's view all beings qua being (or what would perhaps be more accurate, all becomings qua becoming) are subjects and not simply objects. So Benzoni's environmental ethic is both non-relativist (all creatures have moral value independently of human valuation) and non-objectivist (the moral value of all creatures is tied to the fact that all creatures enjoy subjective experience of one sort or another).

Benzoni's work provides an interesting and carefully constructed argument, one that treats issues in cosmology, axiology, philosophical theology, and ethics. Benzoni takes Aquinas's arguments seriously and, at just about every turn, considers potential objections and alternative strategies that Aquinas (or a Thomist) might employ in order to avoid Benzoni's deconstructive conclusions. His exposition of Whitehead is admirably clear and well-organized. I do, however, think there are some problems with Benzoni's arguments. I mention here just three criticisms of Benzoni's critique of Aquinas's thought; I also raise three objections for Benzoni's Whitehead-inspired environmental ethic.

It is clear that Aquinas believes that rational creatures alone are beings that God governs for their own sake (see, e.g., Summa contra gentiles, book III, ch. 121). What is not clear, however, is whether we should agree with Benzoni that x's having moral worth is equivalent to x's being such that God has care for it for its own sake. For example, (as Benzoni himself point out) Aquinas clearly believes it is morally wrong to be cruel to non-human animals. Now, to be sure, Aquinas's reason for thinking it is morally wrong to be cruel to animals is that such cruelty will make it is easier for someone to develop a moral character such that she would be inclined to be cruel to human beings. But although such moral consideration for non-human animals is clearly indirect, it is a form of moral consideration. Such indirect moral consideration recognizes that there is something that we share with animals that we are obligated to remember, namely, a capacity for sensitivity to pleasure and pain. Although Benzoni considers in a footnote (n. 4, p. 191) the possibility that indirect moral consideration should indeed count as a type of moral worth, he is dismissive of the idea.

Furthermore, even if Aquinas does not explicitly say so, we owe non-rational creatures direct moral consideration on Thomistic grounds, since being cruel to an animal -- needlessly causing an animal pain -- violates the natural law. The natural law is created reason's participation in God's divine plan for the universe, i.e., the eternal law. It would seem that we have a duty to treat a creature in a way that is consistent with the kind of thing that it is, i.e., in a manner that takes into account the way in which it has been designed by God. Now animals, for example, are creatures that by divine design feel pleasure and pain. Although we are not obligated to treat such creatures as moral ends in themselves, we are obligated to use such creatures in a manner that is in accord with the way God has made them. To be cruel to an animal amounts to using a creature in a manner that involves intentionally neglecting the manner in which that creature (in accord with its kind) mirrors the perfection of its Creator. Indeed, even to destroy a non-conscious creature for no reason -- or no sufficient reason -- takes some goodness out of the world for no (sufficient) reason. But to destroy goodness for no (sufficient) reason is irrational and any irrational act is a morally evil act. Therefore, given Aquinas's meta-ethic -- which entails that 'being' and 'goodness' are convertible -- destroying a non-conscious creature for no (sufficient) reason is a morally evil act. In general, it would be morally wrong to use or destroy one of God's creatures for no (sufficient) reason. Thus, I don't think Benzoni is correct to say that Aquinas's anthropocentric moral theory entails that it is rational to treat non-rational creatures as though they have no moral worth.

A second problem with Benzoni's argument lies in the fact that he thinks that Aquinas's "moral bifurcation" between rational and non-rational creatures stands or falls with (a) Aquinas's view that the human soul is a subsistent form, and (b) the soundness of Aquinas's arguments for the immateriality and incorruptibility of the human soul. As Benzoni's own exegesis of Aquinas's texts makes clear (see, e.g., p. 64), the philosophical ground of Aquinas's belief that there is a radical difference between human beings and other material creatures lies not (necessarily) in his view that the human soul is a subsistent form, but rather in the fact of our experience that humans have powers that non-rational creatures do not possess, namely, intellect and will (see, e.g., Summa theologiae IaIIae q. 1, a. 2, c.). Such powers are necessary for knowing, choosing, and loving. So a materialist could agree with Aquinas that there is a radical difference between, say, human beings and other material creatures. If a philosopher qua philosopher can draw a sharp distinction between human beings and non-rational creatures on the basis that human beings can, for example, cognize universals and act freely whereas non-rational creatures cannot, this would seem to be sufficient reason for making a sharp distinction between human beings and non-rational creatures, thereby making an anthropocentric ethical theory (such as Aquinas's) at least a candidate for being a viable ethical theory. Benzoni's assumption (3) is false.

Given that Aquinas is clearly developing an ethic that draws on his own religious tradition, it also seems odd for Benzoni to think that what Aquinas says about the ethical life stands or falls with a philosophical argument for the immateriality of the human soul. Now, of course, Aquinas thinks he can offer a sound philosophical argument that the human soul is subsistent and incorruptible. But assume for the sake of argument that Benzoni is correct that there are (intractable) problems with Aquinas's philosophical arguments for the subsistence of the human soul. Why can't Aquinas (or a Thomist) simply take the soul's subsistence as a theological given (as for example, he does with respect to the doctrines of the Trinity and the Incarnation)? Or, perhaps the soul's subsistence is a conclusion of a theological argument. For example, we might argue that the subsistence of the human soul is the only way to make sense of the following cluster of intellectual commitments, each of which constitutes an integral part of the Catholic Christian faith: (a) human beings survive the earthly death of their bodies; (b) there is a general resurrection of the dead, i.e., the dead are raised in their bodies at one and the same time before the throne of Christ; (c) prior to the general resurrection, the saints are able to hear and respond to our prayers. In addition, Aquinas has scriptural (e.g., John 4:24) and philosophical reasons for believing that God is an immaterial being. If humans are made in the "image and likeness of God," it stands to reason that Aquinas would believe that human beings are spiritual as well as material creatures.

A third problem with Benzoni's analysis of Aquinas's thought has to do with his criticism of the five ways. Benzoni argues that Aquinas's discussion of God's existence and nature, e.g., in the Summa theologiae, is viciously circular because the arguments for God's existence there presuppose some coherent account of the way positive expressions apply to God, and a coherent account of the way positive expressions apply to God presupposes that we have successfully demonstrated that God exists. Why think the arguments for the existence of God presuppose a coherent theory of analogous naming? An expression predicated of x and y is predicated equivocally or analogously or univocally. If an argument from effect to cause involves an equivocation, then that argument fails. Aquinas thinks that positive expressions can't be predicated of God and creatures in a univocal fashion (see, e.g., Summa theologiae Ia. q. 13, a. 5). But the five ways predicate positive expressions of God and creatures, e.g., 'mover' (the first way), 'cause' (the second way), etc. So, if the five ways are to be successful arguments, they must predicate terms analogously of God and creatures. Now Benzoni thinks that in order to know whether an expression (such as 'being') that we use of creatures applies to God, we need to know first whether God exists.

I think he's wrong, for two reasons. First, one can apply a term to a non-existent thing, or to something one doesn't know exists. For example, I might talk about a unicorn, even though I know there aren't any such things. Why should we think that a discussion of the way we talk about God presupposes that God exists? As Aquinas points out:

In order to prove the existence of anything, it is necessary to accept as a middle term the meaning of the word [being applied to the hypothetically existing thing], and not the essence [of the hypothetically existing thing]… . Now the names given to God are derived from his effects; consequently, in demonstrating the existence of God from His effects, we may take for the middle term the meaning of the word 'God' (Summa theologiae Ia. q. 2, a. 2, ad2).[1]

So for the sake of the five ways, we presuppose that 'God,' whatever else it means, picks out the first mover, if there is one. Furthermore, because we're talking about God, 'mover' in this context is going to apply to God and creatures in an analogous and not a univocal fashion.

Second, the five ways themselves are meant to demonstrate at one and the same time that given there is something moving, caused to exist, etc., (a) there must be a first mover, cause, etc. and that (b) given the kind of mover, cause, etc. we've arrived at by way of the argument, the terms 'mover', 'cause', etc. have to be applied to cause and effect in an analogous manner. Why think 'mover' applies to something in an analogous sense when compared to the movers in our everyday experience? If 'mover' did not apply to a first mover in an analogous sense when compared to the movers in our everyday experience, then there would be no first, unmoved mover, but rather an infinite number of moved movers. But that is a conclusion the arguments suggest is absurd. Whatever else we might think of Aquinas's five ways, these arguments are not arguing in a circle.

Having made some remarks concerning Benzoni's attempt to deconstruct Aquinas's thought, I want to offer three critical remarks about Benzoni's own positive project. First, Benzoni wants to say that an advantage for Whitehead's approach to reality over against Aquinas's "dualist" metaphysic is that in Whitehead's metaphysic all things belong to one and the same genus, subject, or valuer. This allows us to construct a scientific view of ultimate reality. But Whitehead's panpsychism has some counter-intuitive implications. For example, on Benzoni's reading of Whitehead, all entities are genuinely free (p. 152) and decide upon courses of action (p. 151). Of course, rational creatures enjoy a greater degree of freedom than non-rational creatures for Whitehead. But to speak of an unconscious being as deciding upon a course of action or acting freely is, as far as I can tell, to empty those expressions of meaning. As Benzoni points out, approvingly, Whitehead is taking 'free' as a synonym for 'indeterminate' (p. 152). But even if we think that acting freely is incompatible with determinism, surely it would seem odd to say that a spontaneous occurrence is necessarily something free. Intuitively, we think there is an intimate connection between the ability to reason and the ability to act freely.

Second, according to Benzoni's environmental ethic, all creatures are worthy of direct moral consideration in the sense that they should be treated as moral ends in themselves. Now it is clear that Benzoni is at pains to note that God's creatures have different degrees of moral worth insofar as they belong to different kinds, and so rational beings have greater moral worth than non-rational creatures. What is not clear is how his theory is supposed to work itself out in practice (and Benzoni says next to nothing about such practical applications of his theory in this book). To take just one example, can I kill a creature x, not in order to secure a good for x, e.g., that justice be done with respect to x, but for some good other than the good of x and still be treating x as a moral end in itself? I don't see how. Therefore, since Benzoni's environmental ethics entails that we treat all creatures as moral ends in themselves, it seems to follow on his theory that it would be morally wrong to kill a living thing, say, in order to eat it. But that seems absurd.

Third, if we say with Benzoni that rational and non-rational creatures alike are to be treated as moral ends in themselves, won't that raise practical problems for the safe-guarding of human life? For example, if non-rational creatures and rational creatures alike are to be treated as moral ends in themselves, it might seem reasonable to some to sacrifice the lives of some human being(s), e.g., the weak or defenseless, for the sake of preserving some good associated with a whole host of (healthy) non-rational creatures, e.g., a habitat. This possibility strikes me as genuinely worrisome in an age when it is all too easy for us to neglect atrocities committed against human beings; furthermore, Benzoni does not address this sort of worry at all here.

These objections notwithstanding, in my view the reader who is interested in a deeper exploration of the thought of either Aquinas or Whitehead will not be disappointed by taking some time to read carefully through this book. In addition, Benzoni does us all a great service by artfully demonstrating the interdependency of the disciplines of metaphysics and (environmental) ethics. With all apologies to Kant, Benzoni shows us by example that "metaphysics without ethics is empty, but ethics without metaphysics is blind."

I offer thanks to Merry Brown, Bryan Cross, and Michael Rota for helpful comments on this review.

[1] Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province (Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981).