Ecological Thinking: The Politics of Epistemic Location

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Lorraine Code, Ecological Thinking: The Politics of Epistemic Location, Oxford University Press, 2006, 344pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0195159446.

Reviewed by Sharyn Clough, Oregon State University


Code's book is important and timely, marshalling a wide variety of arguments in support of the necessarily messy and complex effects of philosophical holism and naturalism as applied to ecological studies, broadly construed. She properly conceives of ecology as including the human animal, defining ecology as "a study of habitats both physical and social where people endeavor to live well together … " (p. 25). Indeed, the inclusion of the human animal is probably responsible for a large share of the messiness and complexity. Nonetheless, Code ably navigates her reader through the morass, highlighting a number of examples of ecological thinking in action.

The book is comprised of seven chapters, beginning with an appreciative analysis of Rachel Carson's work, as well as biologist Karen Messing's research on occupational health (ch. 1) and ending with Code's own ecological media analysis of a case of whistle-blowing in the pharmaceutical industry (ch. 7). In addition to the work of scientists such as Rachel Carson, philosophers as varied as Cornelius Castoriadis, Donna Haraway, Kristin Shrader-Frechette and the later Wittgenstein figure as exemplars of her prescribed ecological approach.

The empiricist worldview that she sees her ecological strategy replacing or at least enhancing is a target she has focused on in previous work (as early as her Epistemic Responsibility [1987, University Press of New England]), and is implicated here for its

excessive veneration of the mastery, efficiency, and control modern science is imagined to provide, … [and its strategy] of reducing objects of knowledge to putatively basic units, often in the form of 'observational simples' abstracted from their surroundings. (p. 11)

For the most part, Code assumes that her audience will be well-versed in the problems with the empiricist tradition; however, she does not use this assumption as an excuse to characterize it in terms its adherents would necessarily resist. The (aspects of the) empiricist tradition of which she is critical are presented in all the detail required to give the tradition a full voice.

Equally important, Code's prescriptive ecological approach is not an overly simple antidote; it does not romanticize or spiritualize notions of "nature" or the "environment." Regarding the notion of "ecosystem" that informs her ecological model she writes: "Ecosystems -- both metaphorical and literal -- are as cruel as they are kind, as unpredictable and overwhelming as they are orderly and nurturant, as unsentimentally destructive of their less viable members as they are cooperative and mutually sustaining," and "ecological thinking," she continues, "is as available for feeding self-serving romantic fantasies as for inspiring socially-responsible transformations," (p. 6). Throughout the work, Code is also concerned not to replicate the essentializing tendencies of earlier work in ecofeminism -- that is, the "essentializing [of] 'nature' as benign, and essentializing 'woman' as close to, at one with, immersed in nature, and therefore also inherently good, caring" (p. 16). On a related point, her work presents some of the first really "thick" attempts I've read to integrate the variables of gender, race and class in ways that better represent how those variables play out in real lives.

However, her judicious, complex characterizations of both the empiricist tradition and her own prescribed ecological view, sometimes make for a fuzziness in presentation that leaves her prescriptions unclear in at least two ways.

First, while I appreciate that Code advocates "close to the ground" research that is attentive to the untidy details of complex ecological settings -- I have advocated a similar approach in my own work -- it is not clear from Code's presentation which ecological details have epistemic priority; that is, there is a lack of clarity about what features of any given ecological setting should function as objective constraints on epistemic interpretation. Code is certainly aware of this issue. By her own admission, ecological thinking "emerges from and addresses so many interwoven and sometimes contradictory issues -- feminist, classist, environmental, post-colonial, racist, sexist -- that its implications require multifaceted chartings" (p. 4). Her discussion of the whistle-blowing case in Ch. 7 is particularly illustrative of this problem. After presenting a number of conflicting, though equally compelling, readings of the media presentations of the protagonist in the case, Dr. Olivieri, Code acknowledges that the

readings of the Olivieri affair in this chapter have, admittedly, posed more questions than they answer. Answering them, I have suggested, requires negotiations more cognizant of the detail of human lives and locations than the stripped-down examples that orthodox epistemology serves up as paradigmatic. (p. 277)

The negative point about the restrictions of orthodox epistemology is well taken, but I was left wanting more positive direction here. If we are to acknowledge that the social features of the knower are epistemically significant, rather than merely ad hominem (or ad feminam), then we need to have clearer arguments than those provided by Code, detailing how we might objectively adjudicate between epistemically appropriate and inappropriate backgrounds, values, and worldviews of various knowers.

A second source of ambiguity is that the myriad examples of the ecological approach she supports equivocate with respect to whether she is offering a new epistemology, or rather improving and augmenting the strengths of the empiricist tradition, especially in its more naturalist strains. She revisits this tension throughout the text, sometimes suggesting that hers is a very different project from the traditional epistemological offerings, as in the following:

I am suggesting that the precepts, principles, practices and ideologies of orthodox epistemology are not merely reconfigured but reimagined, rethought all the way through, when they are thought ecologically. It is not that some pieces of an epistemological system are rejigged, some cast-offs reclaimed, and some rejects recycled from a misremembered romantic and symbiotic era, but a whole way of thinking about the diverse positionings and responsibilities of knowing subjects, the "nature" of knowledge and its place in the social-political-natural world are differently thought (p. 61).

However, in Code's comparison of Carson's approach with those of Carson's peers, for example, it is clear that the work of her peers just wasn't good enough by the traditional empirical standards of evidence they themselves claimed to accept. Arbitrarily dismissing some evidence, and inappropriately valorizing other sources of evidence, as they seemed to do, is bad empirical science. I think the ability to point this out is a powerful tool in the feminist/ecological arsenal and Code avails herself of this tool in some cases but not others.

In Ch. 3, "Negotiating Empiricism" Professor Code makes a point of arguing that merely including more, knowing more, evidence is not enough (p. 115). We must also "reimagine" what appropriate evidence would look like. This argument helps clarify her position about how she's using the notion of empirical "evidence" but again, it invites a larger question regarding her claim that she is offering a new epistemology. More often than not it looks as if she's offering a more conservative call (and not a bad call for being conservative on this point) -- a call for us to be better "empiricists," to be more intellectually honest, to be open to diverse sources of evidence, sources that had previously been disallowed for inappropriate reasons, etc. This more conservative view is voiced in passages like the following:

Ecological naturalism neither turns its back on empirical knowledge-gathering processes nor eschews standard scientific practices of observation, justification, and evaluation. But it reassesses them in their specificity, relocates them to consider how they can function productively together with other ways of achieving knowledge, revaluates them for their sensitivity to the detail of geographical and human specificity, of habitat and ethos (p.68).

In some ways my comments here are referencing an "old" debate within feminist epistemology: namely, whether to conceptualize one's critical work as focused on instances of "bad science" or, more radically, on "science as usual." I am on the side of keeping the focus on "bad science" as a way to use the very criteria accepted by scientists themselves to criticize what they're doing, but it's not always so clear which side Code herself wants to support. The discussion of Messing's work in occupational health, for example, seems to be in terms of how Messing's work pays greater attention to the empirical detail provided by sources inappropriately ignored by previous studies -- i.e., Messing's work is an improvement over previous "bad science." I wondered then, how this fit with Code's call for a new epistemology, rather than a much better, more complex, and necessarily untidy analysis of the empirical data we all try to be responsible to as good empiricist thinkers. Perhaps this is a question of whether she is advocating a qualitative or quantitative change in epistemology, or whether perhaps the quantitative shift is so large that it becomes a qualitative shift. Again though, Code is certainly aware of the ambiguity of the status of her ecological prescriptions, relative to current, more traditional offerings, and she plays with the tension in interesting ways.

In general, these moments of ambiguity are more than compensated for by the scope of Code's overall presentation and the skill with which she presents the material. The arguments she offers are complex and rise to the challenge presented to any philosopher working to make intellectual analysis relevant to social policy in the contemporary world.