Ecstasy, Catastrophe: Heidegger from Being and Time to the Black Notebooks

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David Farrell Krell, Ecstasy, Catastrophe: Heidegger from Being and Time to the Black Notebooks, SUNY Press, 2015, 201pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438458250.

Reviewed by Richard Capobianco, Stonehill College


This latest book by the distinguished scholar, translator, and author David Farrell Krell is a compilation of three different texts. Part I presents four Brauer Lectures he delivered at Brown University (2014) on Heidegger's early thinking on the human being's "ecstatic temporality." Following is a brief "Interlude" in which he reflects on the vice of "polemical" criticism and the virtue of "giving oneself over" to a text in interpreting it. Part II is an extended essay on Heidegger agonistes as this emerges in the recently published Schwarze Hefte (Black Notebooks). Krell has insightful and suggestive things to say in each, but the three parts do not fit well together.

The topic of Krell's Brauer Lectures is Heidegger's understanding of "ecstatic temporality" in Being and Time, specifically in sections 65 and 68. As he notes at the outset, the book's first four chapters retain the informal speaking style of the lectures. The merit of this decision is that the reader has the opportunity to appreciate his engaging lecture style; it is abundantly clear that he is a learned, witty, and lively lecturer and teacher. Yet the energy of his spoken word proves to be problematical as a written text. Often, precisely at a critical juncture in his presentation and elucidation of a key point on Heidegger, the lecture text gallops ahead to a reference to Aristotle or Schelling or Hölderlin (or to a host of other authors and works of literature and art). All of this associated material is rich, indeed, and a signature of Krell's style, but Heidegger's text under consideration often gets lost in the thicket of references.

The crux of Krell's reading of "ecstatic temporality," which he maintains is "one of Heidegger's greatest achievements," is that this phenomenological account makes manifest how the "suddenness," "seizure," "rupture," "momentousness" of our temporal existence rises up and drives us out of the inauthenticity of everyday deadened time and thrusts us into the radicality of the time of our lives, which is decisively finite, uncertain, and anxious. He begins with the intention of examining Heidegger's understanding of "ecstatic," but he cannot help but pause at length to consider where Heidegger may have "found" the idea of ecstatic temporality. His lecture veers into a discussion of Schelling only to conclude that it is "highly unlikely" that Schelling was the source. He then asserts that "we may say, indeed we must [his italics] say, that Heidegger gets the idea of ecstasy from Aristotle's treatise on time," and he points to chapters 10-14 of Physics, Book IV (16-17). His discussion of Aristotle's text is provocative, but we are left wondering why Aristotle "must" have been Heidegger's source. Perhaps this "must" was a useful rhetorical turn in the lecture hall, but it does not translate well to the page. It is not clear why we "must" understand Aristotle to be the source and, moreover, why we "must" understand Aristotle's account of time to be "tragic," which Krell maintains is the upshot of Heidegger's account as well:

I repeat, this must be the source of Heidegger's notion of "ecstatic temporality." Not only does Aristotle establish the relation of the ecstatic to existence in general, but he also sees that ecstasy entails departure and loss: the tragic tone of both his and Heidegger's thinking would here be set in stone or, better, branded on the flesh of each (17).

He notes -- and laments -- that almost immediately after Being and Time, Heidegger abandoned the theme of Dasein's "tragic" ecstatic temporality. He rightly points out that beginning in the 1930's, Heidegger moved on to the thinking of Being as aletheia (and as physis) and to the consideration of "the temporality of Being itself" as the primordial "time-space" (Zeit-Raum). Oddly, though, he cannot make any sense of this "turn" in Heidegger's thinking. He concludes that "The truth is that neither Derrida nor I nor anyone else I know has genuine insight into the question as to why Heidegger abandons the ecstatic analysis" (18). Yet surely one can offer something more than this by way of explanation. In particular, we must consider, as I think Krell would likely agree, that Heidegger simply could not arrive at his stated goal in Being and Time of thinking Being-as-time by persisting in the transcendental-phenomenological analysis of Dasein's ecstatic temporality. Put more plainly: Heidegger abandoned his analysis of ecstatic temporality because he abandoned the last remnants in his own thinking of the strict transcendental-phenomenological approach of Husserl. Heidegger realized that he could never get to the Temporalität of Being -- the professed aim of Being and Time -- through the Zeitlichkeit of Dasein.

In Part II, Krell (dubiously) claims that the Black Notebooks are not much help in furthering our understanding of Heidegger's thinking and its development, but in this very instance, one of Heidegger's entries from 1934-35 proves to be especially instructive. Throughout the first Notebook (GA 94; covering 1931-38), Heidegger repeatedly expresses his deep discontent with his approach in Being and Time, and at one point states, in a most dramatic fashion, that his draft of the final part of Being and Time simply "had to be destroyed." One may say that the entirety of the famous "turn" (die Kehre) in Heidegger's thinking is crystallized in this one Notebook entry:

Being and Time is not a "philosophy about time," and even less so a teaching on the "temporality" (Zeitlichkeit) of the human being, but rather clearly and surely path to the grounding of the truth of Being; of Being itself, and not of beings, and also not of beings as beings. Leading the way is the leap into "Temporality" (Temporalität), into that wherein primordial time with primordial space essence together as unfoldings of the essencing of truth, of its [truth's] transporting-transfixing clearing (Lichtung) and concealing. Of course, [therefore], the first, insufficient version of the third section of the first part of Being and Time had to be destroyed. (GA 94: 272; Heidegger's italics)

What is fascinating is how after the "turn" the later Heidegger attempted, in an implicit way at least, to incorporate his earlier analysis of Dasein's ecstatic temporality into his thinking about the temporality of Being itself.[1] Krell does not pursue this matter of the later Heidegger's thinking about Being-as-time -- and one cannot help but think that such an effort would have made Part II more interesting.

Even so, Part I Krell unfolds his account of the existential implications of "ecstatic temporality" by way of his distinctive style of bringing a wealth of related material to bear on Heidegger's indications. In chapter 1, he amplifies his understanding of "ecstatic" as "displacement" and "departure" through a discussion of Schelling, and he hears the theme of "the sudden rupture of time" resonating in the word "rapture" in Augustine's Confessions -- and resonating as well in Plato's Gorgias, Aeschylus's Prometheus Bound, the Epic of Gilgamesh and Mahler's Sixth Symphony.[2] Chapter 2 says more about our anxious "ex-centric" temporal existence through nuanced readings of Hölderlin's poetry. Chapter 3 takes up a discussion of what Krell calls "the ecstatic 'other end' of Dasein," namely, birth. He notes that Heidegger's few remarks on the existential significance of "birth" inspired Hannah Arendt, but Krell is inspired, too. Several pages into the chapter he announces that he is moving beyond the letter of the text to commence "a far-flung fantasy" that conjures "Bébé Dasein" and "Childe Heidegger" in order to "re-write" Being and Time from the point of view of the child. What follows is principally a Freudian tale of our troubled and anxious finitude "at the other end," and the lesson learned is that "the natality of our existence . . . [is] the very enigma of having-been" (104).

Krell opens chapter 4, the final lecture, by invoking Lacan's "mirror-stage" analysis of ego-formation with the aim of further dismantling the unity of the self and its "time." Yet he moves on quickly to a lengthy explication of Derrida's first seminar on Heidegger, Heidegger: The Question of Being and History, which Derrida taught in 1964-65 when he was 34 years old. This seminar text has not yet been translated into English, so Krell's scholarship in this section is especially valuable and noteworthy, especially for those readers in English who are interested in the young Derrida's encounter with Heidegger's thinking. Krell elucidates -- and reinforces in his own way -- Derrida's understanding of the transcendence of Dasein as "this exit from the self" (103). For Krell, following Derrida, the time of our lives is unremittingly ruptured and anxious, our past "enigmatic" and our future "problematic." Perhaps. Yet we have good reasons to doubt that Heidegger's account of ecstatic temporality can be pushed this far. Krell pushes nonetheless, and he does so with rhetorical jouissance. It comes as no surprise, then, that he does not take up the later Heidegger who makes a turn in the early 1940s toward our serene being-at-home in relation to Being as the temporal shining-forth of all beings and things and who speaks about Being as Ereignis as "the most gentle of all laws" that gathers each being into what it properly is and into a belonging together with all other beings (GA 12: 248).

In Part II, Krell critically addresses the first three (of four) recently published Black Notebooks, which despite the ominous-sounding title are simply "considerations" or "reflections" (Überlegungen) that Heidegger jotted down in private "black" notebooks over much of the course of his lifetime. The first four volumes (GA 94-97; not yet translated into English; translations my own) cover the early 1930s to the late 1940s. Additional notebooks from the later years will be published in due course. The publication of the first four notebooks has caused quite a stir because of certain controversial entries, especially regarding "world Jewry," and a great deal has already been spoken and written about these remarks. Even so, to put things into some perspective, I would observe that the remarks that have attracted so much attention are few in number in relation to the hundreds and hundreds of "considerations" that Heidegger offers in these notebooks. A full vetting of Heidegger's callous and inflammatory comments is altogether appropriate, but there is much more to these notebooks that deserve attention, particularly his properly philosophical notes that are helpful in elucidating his principal ideas and terms and in clarifying the development of his thinking. No matter how strenuous the effort, the distinction between Heidegger the man and his times and Heidegger the thinker cannot be collapsed altogether. The work of every great philosopher, poet, artist, and composer cannot be reduced to biography.

Krell tells us at the outset of chapter 5 that he felt so compelled to address the Black Notebooks after their initial publication and negative reception that he interrupted his preparation of the Brauer Lectures. One may regret that he did so because although his overall account of Heidegger in these notebooks is discerning, still, this long essay is simply more of the same "reaction" literature that has appeared thus far. The essay is far better suited to The New York Review of Books than as the second half of a book on "ecstatic temporality." Krell on the later Heidegger on Being as primordial "time-space" would have been preferable to Krell on Heidegger agonistes in the Notebooks.

Nevertheless, this part of the book will be rewarding for those who are keenly interested in Heidegger the man and his misguided observations on the social, economic, political, religious, and cultural currents churning in the 1930s. Krell brings to light the Heidegger of the 1930s who was enraged by just about everything; it is a portrait of a man who is often resentful, grandiose, humorless, and lacking in self-awareness. Unfortunately, however, Krell does not give us any sense of Heidegger the philosopher and thinker as he is underway revising earlier ideas and thinking toward new positions which would come to define his later work. Krell writes, "there is, in my view, precious little of philosophical or 'thoughtful' importance in the three volumes I have read" (130), but, as I noted earlier, this is a hasty and dubious conclusion. Admittedly, the Notebooks will never be essential reading, but they certainly do offer important supplementary material to his published work as well as crucial insights into the development of his thinking after Being and Time. His reflection on the need for a transition to the thinking of the temporality of Being itself, which I cited above, is one good example. But there are many more. Also in the first notebook (1930s), Heidegger clarifies that from the outset of his Denkweg it was the experience of the primacy or priority of Being in relation to all modes of knowing that was decisive -- a reversal of the Neo-Kantian and Husserlian transcendental privileging of the noetic. A leitmotif of all his later work takes shape in this entry: Being as "primordial truth" (aletheia) as the temporal-spatial unfolding/emerging/opening/clearing of all beings:

The fundamental experience of my thinking: The predominancy of Beyng before all beings . . . Beyng, however, not as object of thinking and representing, and the predominancy [of Beyng] not as the a priori in the sense of the condition of objectifying; all of this is only the foreground and distant consequence of the primal inceptualizing -- but again rapidly receding -- Beyng. The predominancy of Beyng [as] unfolding in the primordial truth -- from out of which [primordial truth], and in which therefrom, every being arises in the first place (GA 94: 362; Heidegger's italics).

In the fourth Notebook covering 1942-1948 (GA 97), which Krell did not have an opportunity to consider, the later Heidegger comes into full view, and there is a wealth of material that supplements and amplifies his formal philosophical work of the 1940s. For example, there are a host of entries that speak to his understanding of Being as aletheia(and as physis), which he had worked out in his brilliant lecture courses on Parmenides and Heraclitus in the early 1940s. Aletheia and physis are the "same"; aletheia "belongs" to Being in the first place as "unconcealedness"; aletheia is "the essential feature of Being itself" (GA 97: 442, but also see the entries on 257, 261, 264, 275, 282, 286, 367, 373, 392, 415, and 456).[3] In fact, there is one especially intriguing entry in which Heidegger appears to insist that aletheia as "unconcealedness" and "the free of the clearing" itself (die Lichtung) does not at all require the human being as the site or dative ("for whom") of its manifestation:

Aletheia -- unconcealedness; if it [aletheia -- unconcealedness] is shown to be the unfolding region of everything that comes-to-presence, then one immediately seeks a substrate for it and asks: unconcealed "for" whom?, as if the free of the clearing already had to be accommodated as well (458).[4]

There is no question that the Heidegger of the Notebooks is often revealed to be a flawed man, and this is what all the immediate "reaction" literature, including Krell's discussion in this book, has focused on. But the Notebooks have more to offer than this, and it will take time and patience to sort through and work out the philosophical import of all these reflections. It certainly would be helpful to keep this in mind as the remaining Notebooks from the 1950s on are published.

In-between the book's two parts, Krell inserts an "Interlude," which is the text of a lecture on "polemic and criticism" that he gave at Brown University in 2012. The lecture is highly engaging, but the topic is only marginally related to the rest of the book. His basic point, brought home with personal anecdotes and a multitude of references to individuals and individual works of literature, art, music, and philosophy, is that "polemic" is essentially thoughtless and that "only what magnifies the efforts of others to think and to create merits the name thinking" (124). He makes an impassioned case for our "giving ourselves over" (HingebungHingabe) to a creative work in order to genuinely understand and appreciate it; in effect, we may say that this is Krell's rendering into hermeneutical terms of the famous Anselmian dictum fides quaerens intellectum. His discussion in this lecture of this complex matter of interpretation and criticism is (no doubt intentionally) limited; but as general advice it is wise, and it reveals Krell as a generous and gracious thinker and teacher.

[1] For one of Heidegger's hints, see Richard Capobianco, Heidegger's Way of Being (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2014), chapter 2.

[2] This is a long-standing theme of Krell's. See his Daimon Life: Heidegger and Life-Philosophy (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1992), 101.

[3] Heidegger states clearly, as he did throughout his later work (which covers some forty years), that the source or the "whence" of unconcealment is not the human being, butBeing: "unconcealment unfolding as Being; Being is the whence -- whither and wherein of the unfolding of the unconcealing-concealing" (456).

[4] My thanks to Richard Polt for this reference. Heidegger's entry parallels his statements in his published work (and unpublished lecture courses) of the decade; see, for example, his 1949 statement that "the truth of Being is not exhausted in Dasein" (GA 9: 373-4; see also Heidegger's Way of Being, 62-4, and chapter 1.