Education and Human Values: Reconciling Talent with an Ethics of Care

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Michael Slote, Education and Human Values: Reconciling Talent with an Ethics of Care, Routledge, 2012, 106pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415530958.

Reviewed by Alexander Jech, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


This book provides valuable (if narrow) contributions to the philosophy of education and the ethics of care. The ethics of care, or care ethics, is distinguished from the three main schools of normative ethics -- Kantianism and other forms of deontological rationalism, consequentialism of various kinds, and Neo-Aristotelian virtue ethics -- because it takes the importance of empathy and caring relationships as its starting point. In some cases, this goes no further than complementing the traditional, "masculine" moral language of justice and autonomy through the addition of a "feminine" language of personal bonds, caring, and empathy. However, in its most ambitious forms, such as that endorsed by Michael Slote, care ethics seeks to provide a complete account of normative ethics.

The most complete statement of Slote's version of care ethics can be found in two earlier books, The Ethics of Care and Empathy and Moral Sentimentalism. In them, Slote develops care ethics as a version of moral sentimentalism in the tradition of David Hume and Adam Smith where empathy, or rather "fully developed empathy," is made the moral standard by which everything else is assessed and from which other concepts, such as justice and autonomy, are derived.

In his latest book, Slote is concerned with reconciling care ethics with an educational system that recognizes differences in talent, especially creative talent. To some, recognizing differences in creative talent may appear unproblematic. Others, such as Nel Noddings and John Dewey, are reluctant to acknowledge such differences. Noddings is one of the pioneers of the ethics of care and a noted philosopher of education, while John Dewey's philosophy of education is rooted in a system of democratic ideals in which Slote finds significant affinity with care ethics.

Noddings and Dewey argue that individuals possess a rich variety of different talents and skills and that we cannot simply state that one set of talents is "superior" to another, whether these talents are manual, mathematical, linguistic, aesthetic, etc. We may say that a particular student is superior with respect to a specific ability, such as mathematical ability, but it is not possible to assess one student relative to another absolutely in the same way. The goal of education should be to draw out whatever talents a child has and allow him or her to develop those talents to the greatest possible level, and to avoid glorifying academic talents at the expense of denigrating non-academic ones. Yet the reality, Slote argues, is that there are disparities of creative talent to be acknowledged. Those with the talents of a scientist like Einstein, a composer like Beethoven, or a mathematician like Gauss simply have more creative talent than the rest of us, and it is hard to escape the sense that some activities, too, give more scope to creative talent than others -- that architecture gives more room for creativity than plumbing does, for instance, even once we recognize the importance of plumbing and the scope it affords for the development of valuable sorts of agency.

But from the perspective of an ethics of care, recognizing differences in talent can seem positively uncaring, because of how hurtful it can be to those with lesser talents, especially if those with greater recognition "lord" this over them. In other words, if our society and education system recognizes this, "won't those who pursue architecture feel a sense of smug or arrogant superiority and won't those who become plumbers tend to feel bad or inferior about their occupation?" (14). At one point Slote even mentions, and argues against, the idea of not acknowledging the truth of differences of talent purely out of such concern. The challenge, then, is how an educational system that acknowledges democratic ideals and ideals of caring can recognize disparities in students' degree of talent.

Slote argues that the ethics of care itself provides the necessary palliative resources, so "a decent, caring, democratically oriented philosophy of education needn't deny that there is such a thing as greater or lesser creativity/talent/intelligence" (65). This is because care ethics supports a system of education in which the development of empathy is treated as an essential element of both moral and rational education. Such a system would make extensive use of known methods for developing and extending empathy among its students and therefore provide an environment capable of mitigating the harmful effects of recognizing and acknowledging differences of talent. As Slote puts it, "someone . . . who is both highly talented and also a very caring person is going to understand that it's not very nice to rub people's noses in those differences" (46).

In Chapters 3 and 4 Slote provides his vision of such a system of education, while summarizing and reflecting upon current research, especially the work of Martin Hoffman, on the nature of empathy and the methods by which it is inculcated in children and others (such as "induction" and "modeling"). In the course of his main argument Slote argues that opposing views possess significant flaws in this area (e.g., rationalists such as Kohlberg and Rawls have felt the need to invoke empathy or empathy-like concepts in their own theories about moral education as soon as moral motivation must be explained (29-30), while Aristotelians have "significantly undertheorized" (43) accounts of moral habituation). He also argues, interestingly, that empathy plays a significant role even in such "epistemic" virtues as open-mindedness.

Thus in this system of education, educators will both teach empathy (by induction) and model it (both directly by showing empathy and indirectly via their moral approval of empathetic responses and disapproval of non-empathetic responses), while also carefully inculcating humility regarding one's talents (or gifts). Students should thereby develop strong senses of empathy and grow in their own empathetic responses to one another, with the result that the effects of recognizing and acknowledging differences in students' degrees of talent will be much less harsh. What, then, should we make of Slote's argument?

First, it is not clear to me that it is the behavior of the talented (the "lording it over" that Slote mentions) that makes the recognition of talent difficult for those with lesser talent. "The Revenge of the Nerds" became a movie franchise in the 80's because the less talented were perceived to do the lording over. Those with the greatest academic talent received very little regard from their peers and were in no position to rub their greater talents in anyone's noses. This certainly accords with my own memory of the American school system, especially when considering the treatment and influence of those with markedly superior talents, such as mathematical prodigies. Although a more caring and empathetic peer environment might well have a good purpose, it therefore seems doubtful to me that such an environment will be able to reduce the harshness associated with the realization of one's own lesser talent. (Though perhaps it will make things easier for those with greater talents.) In these situations it seems more characteristic to me that that the painfulness arises from the knowledge that one has "fallen short." Even when a diversity of talents is recognized, it also remains true (as Matthew Crawford's recent Shop Class as Soulcraft reminds us) that manual labor has its own standards of excellence and aristocracies that one may either reach or fall short of.

Second, I find it troubling that, in discussing the question of "esotericism" (that is, whether educators should suppress knowledge of differences in talent, even when these are known to exist), Slote considers the matter solely in terms of summing up the relative psychic harm to the talented (in terms of self-doubt and uncertainty if we suppress this knowledge) and weighing this harm against that inflicted upon the less talented if we do acknowledge differences. It is philosophically maladroit to describe the harm of esotericism in terms of the psychic cost of uncertainty about having a "special task/goal in life" (66). There is a harm involved, but I doubt that the talented whose talents go unrecognized would describe it as that. What is bound to breed resentment under "esotericism" is the sense among the talented that they have been treated unjustly and the reasonable conviction that, whatever the esoteric school system's virtues may be, a concern for truth is not among them. This emphasizes our lingering questions regarding whether virtues like justice and truthfulness are really reducible to empathy and care, as Slote believes, or if instead the attempt to do so requires us tomisdescribe their nature.

I will now turn to Slote's argument for including empathy as an affective component to cognitive virtues like open-mindedness. Building on the work of Michael Stocker,[1] Slote argues that many cognitive virtues possess affective components, and that open-mindedness, or fair-mindedness (Slote treats these as equivalent), specifically requires the use of empathy. The argument seems to develop as follows. Having a particular intellectual point of view involves placing that view in a favorable sort of light. Doing this, as the word "favorable" suggests, involves holding an affective attitude toward it -- a favorable one. "[In] the human case," Slote argues, there are no "purely intellectual states of belief or processes of belief-formation." But then being open-minded to someone else's point of view seems to require that one be capable of having the same or a similar ("possibly mild") favorable emotional response to that point of view -- "empathetically . . . seeing it in something like the favorable light in which the other person sees it" (56). He concludes, "[Fair-mindedness] and open-mindedness are essentially a matter of how one empathically reacts or would react to what others think and say" (59).

Educators can teach this to students by modeling it for them -- by taking their views "seriously" in a manner that follows the lines drawn by Dewey -- and by inductively correcting them when they respond dismissively or contemptuously to the views of others (62). Students taught in this way will adopt similar attitudes, so that more gifted students will learn to listen attentively to what other students have to say, rather than treating them with contempt. Such education prepares students, that is, to treat the views of others "charitably."

Now, Alfred North Whitehead famously remarked, "The safest general characterization of the philosophical tradition is that it consists of a series of footnotes to Plato,"[2] and it is on this point especially that we can see how this is true of Slote's argument. His account of "open-mindedness" is actually quite helpful for thinking about the nature and virtues of philosophical dialogue and other polyphonic forms of philosophical argument, and what separates a good philosophical dialogue from philosophical argument merely given in dialogue form. This can be helpful for identifying what it is that gives Plato's better dialogues their marked superiority to the dialogues of a great many later philosophers.

First, the method of the Platonic dialogues seems to presuppose that there is something worth hearing about important topics even from people who are not particularly wise, though what they possess may be only a tiny kernel of truth that can be drawn out through engagement in philosophical discussion. It likewise presupposes thats evens a philosopher like Socrates doesn't have so much of the truth that he can simply dismiss the opinions of such people, and that even the "wisest" among us needs a certain kind of humility. Socrates therefore models a kind of humility and "empathetic" openness to the points of view of others, and Slote's account of open-mindedness helps us to see why these are important features to portray in dialogue's protagonist. If what is wanted is a means for simply providing the reader with information, the dialogue form is poorly chosen, since it can only reiterate the relationship of author and reader.

Second, part of what makes Plato's better dialogues so excellent -- we see this especially in dialogues like the Symposium and the Gorgias, where readers often come away more moved by Socrates' interlocutors than Socrates himself -- is precisely his ability to present the viewpoint of others in an attractive light. Presenting the viewpoint of another with any skill requires open-mindedness, and ifSlote is right, open-mindedness requires something like seeing the point of adopting a certain point of view in a kind of charitable light. The good dialogue therefore requires this kind of open-mindedness, and it is this that especially distinguishes Plato from someone like Nietzsche, whose persuasive power seems to rest upon his ability to foreclose the possibility of empathetic response with opposing viewpoints. Nietzsche was also concerned with identifying the "point" or rather the motivational origin of various viewpoints, but no one reads him and comes away with deepened appreciation for Christianity or "last men" or English Utilitarianism. Plato, in Slote's words, takes his opponents' points of view "seriously" in a way that Nietzsche does not. Of course, about any particular point of view it may be an open question which of these approaches is more just to utilize, and this may hint at a question about Slote's system of education as well -- how far should educators' empathy extend?

Third, there is at least one noteworthy way in which the Platonic dialogues illuminate something about Slote's vision of education that he does not see or does not mention. The value of educators' taking students' views seriously will be compromised if educators are unable to maintain a certain distance from those views even while identifying with them, in order to lead students into larger, more adequate views. This distancing will be important if educators are also to model open-mindedness toward their objects of study, since it is not at all straightforward how to be open-minded and empathetic toward the viewpoints of kidnappers, slaveholders, or genocidal warmongers. Here, one sees the importance of the practice of Socratic irony as a method of preventing premature identification with a point of view that may not warrant complete agreement.

The points above suggest that Slote's argument might illuminate something important about the value of the dialogue format for philosophy and the educational value of the Socratic method, and might therefore contribute something beyond what is advertised in the book itself -- i.e., about the philosophy of philosophical education, and why dialogues are useful educational tools for teaching students how to adopt different philosophical points of view.

In conclusion, Education and Human Values (despite its unfortunate title, suggestive of a UN committee report) is worth reading by those interested in the ethics of care or the philosophy of education, and might be assigned in classes on those topics. It may also have value to those interested in moral sentimentalism in general. I am not sure how broad its audience is beyond these, however. It seems too philosophical in its method and targets to be easily useable in schools of education, and its price (at over a hundred dollars) makes it difficult to justify as a textbook. Those in the aforementioned groups, however, should take the time to read it and consider its arguments.

[1] Michael Stocker, "Intellectual Desire, Emotion, and Action," in Explaining Emotions (Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1980), ed. Amelie Rorty.

[2] Alfred North Whitehead, Process and Reality (New York: The Free Press, 1978), 39.