Effective Intentions: The Power of Conscious Will

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Alfred R. Mele, Effective Intentions: The Power of Conscious Will, Oxford UP, 2009, 178pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195384260.

Reviewed by Manuel Vargas, University of San Francisco



Until very recently, it would have struck many philosophers as premature to devote an entire monograph to questions of whether and how neuroscience is relevant to free will and the philosophy of agency. Philosophers of action regarded the relevance of neuroscience to philosophical problems of agency and action as somewhat remote.1 However, the attitude of many neuroscientists and social psychologists was decidedly different. Several prominent neuroscientists became convinced that results from brain science had a good deal to teach us about traditional philosophical issues surrounding action and agency. Benjamin Libet’s research raised some interesting questions, but more recently Daniel Wegner, John Bargh, and Read Montague each declared that free will and/or the apparent causal power of conscious willing was an illusion. These “willusionists”2 garnered national media attention. In more than a few newspapers and magazines there were angst-ridden editorials and a spate of speculative articles about what the illusory nature of our wills might mean for morality, the law, and our daily lives.

Al Mele’s latest book — Effective Intentions: The Power of Conscious Will — is a valuable response and an important corrective to the recent wave of neuroscientific willusionism. Focusing primarily on the work of Libet and Wegner, Mele shows how familiarity with some distinctions regarding action and agency can illuminate existing neuroscientific data on the will. In particular, he demonstrates how the most striking claims of the willusionists depend on an implausible and crude picture of human agency. The book ought to leave willusionists scrambling for some new robes. For reasons I discuss at the end of this review, I doubt that it will.

Effective Intentions‘s chapters are mostly structured around investigating a given claim made by a scientist. For example, Mele takes up Libet’s claim that the brain “decides” to initiate actions prior to subjective awareness of the decision. In another chapter, he takes up Wegner’s view that neuroscience shows that intentions play no causal role in the production of action. Mele does not quarrel with the experimental data per se. Instead, his focus is largely on the interpretation of those data.

Put this way, the work of Effective Intentions may suggest a piece of comparatively pedestrian philosophical maneuvering. On this model, the philosopher replies to troublesome empirical data by offering an alternative explanation that fits with the facts. Mele, however, does more than generate piecemeal alternative hypotheses from the armchair. For example, in chapter 3 he uses the results of reaction time studies to cast doubt on the details of Libet’s claims about when an agent intends to act. Throughout the book he evinces a willingness to take experimental data very seriously. He goes so far as to outline hypothetical experimental results that — were they demonstrated — would lead him to accept, variously, epiphenomenalism about proximal intentions (i.e., intentions about what to do now), the thesis that all proximal intentions are acquired unconsciously, and the claim that no one has free will. So, there is an honest engagement with the experimental data that should cheer those who favor such projects. At the core of the book, though, is the business of showing how there is a plausible, systematic, and principled alternative interpretation to the experimental data to which willusionists frequently appeal.

Mele opens the book by showing why we should want to distinguish between, for example, desires, decisions, and intentions — at least if we wish to make sense of action in a way that is continuous with ordinary explanations of it. One can, of course, reject this latter project, which seeks to understand the nature and structure of action partly in terms of the distinctions grounded in our ordinary vocabulary of action explanations. Indeed, there is some sense in which rejecting this project is precisely the aim of Mele’s interlocutors. However, inasmuch as their arguments depend on showing that conventional explanations of action are falsified by experimental data, then their characterization of conventional explanations of action needs to be accurate. It is on precisely this latter point — the accuracy with which willusionists have characterized the resources of our standard explanations of action - that Mele makes trouble for willusionists. We might say that the fundamental lesson of Mele’s book is that if we have a suitably sophisticated understanding of the distinctions and resources implicit in (and/or consistent with) ordinary explanations of actions, neuroscientific willusionism will seem unappealing.

Over a series of chapters, Mele illustrates how most willusionists are working with a startlingly crude picture of agency. So, for example, Wegner claims that "Intention is normally understood as an idea of what one is going to do that appears in consciousness just before one does it" (quoted on Mele 24). Mele points out that this is neither necessary nor sufficient for being an intention. It is not necessary, because distal intentions can occur to agents long before one does some action, and indeed, the doing of the action does not obviously require that the distal intention spring to mind at the moment of action. It is not sufficient, either, as Wegner’s characterization is too coarse-grained to distinguish intentions from predictions. I might predict that I am about to hit a car (such that “the idea of what one is going to do appears in conscious just before one does it”), but it does not follow that I thereby intend to hit the car. Such distinctions may sound simple, perhaps even nit-picky. Effective Intentions shows why this reaction is in error.

One particularly important idea that emerges in the book is this: whether an agent has an intention is distinct from whether that agent is conscious of him or herself having that intention. That is, Mele suggests that one might have nonconscious intentions. Neuroscientific willusionists have overlooked this possibility, and Mele thinks that the plausibility of our having such attitudes, and their role in the production of action, undermines almost every interesting argument for willusionism. How this works is both ingenious and, at least in retrospect, surprisingly straightforward. For example, Wegner maintains that conscious intentions arrive too late on the scene to be involved in action production. To make his argument work, Wegner appeals to a diverse range of studies (including some of Libet’s), most of which rely on an agent’s report of their beliefs about when they became conscious of an intention to act. If there are nonconscious intentions, however, these data will not show that intentions have no role in the production of action. At best, they indicate the timing of when an agent came to have a belief about when he or she became aware of a conscious proximal intention to act. Even better, Mele goes on to show why there is some reason to think that there is a nonconscious intention operating in the causal sequence, even if the agent is not consciously aware of its presence or role in the production of action.

Several brief points of clarification are in order. First, Mele’s notion of a nonconscious intention is not presented as an invocation of a more general Freudian framework. Mele’s notion of a nonconscious intention makes no appeal to an active, unconscious agency that is in some sense at cross-purposes with consciousness. Such an account may be consistent with Mele’s conception of nonconscious intentions, but his account of nonconscious intentions does not require it to be. Second, Mele treads lightly around whether nonconscious intentions properly count as intentions. Mele seems to endorse the idea that there is likely some attitude or mental entity (or its physical realizer) that has the basic functional properties as proximal intentions, but that, at least sometimes, is nonconscious. However, the details of his argument tend to proceed in a somewhat conditional way: if there are such things, they would make a difference for the interpretation of the experimental results. So, as important as the idea is to the book, it is a bit unclear about just how much Mele takes himself to be committed to the existence of honest-to-goodness intentions that are nonconscious.

Although Mele is not the first or only person to have suggested the possibility of nonconscious intentions, there has been comparatively little discussion of this idea in both the neuroscience literature and in contemporary philosophy of action. Hence, Mele’s invocation and use of the idea is an important development. It does raise some questions about how such intentions operate, and their tractability in a broadly causal, naturalistic explanatory framework. For example, how might we identify the presence of a nonconscious intention? What makes the difference with respect to whether a given intention is conscious or not? Does consciousness make a difference (and if so, what difference?) to whether intentions are better at fulfilling whatever functional roles define them?

Mele acknowledges that some might be inclined to think that consciousness of that intention is somehow built in to the very idea of an intention. Wegner and Bargh, for example, assume that intentions must be conscious. We might wonder whether proponents of such a view, now that they are so pressed, might generate some account of why consciousness is an essential feature of intentions. As Mele notes, however, the very idea of nonconscious intentions should not seem especially bizarre for those who think about intentions in terms of functional roles: it is not obvious that any or many of those roles make references to consciousness (37-8). Indeed, Mele declares that he can think of “no good argument for the conceptual thesis that necessarily all proximal intentions are conscious intentions” (107).

On Mele’s account the possibility of nonconscious intentions is not meant to exclude the possibility that there are virtues to being conscious of intentions. In chapter 7, Mele considers ways in which consciousness of intentions might make them particularly efficacious (he focuses on implementation intentions, or more specific intentions concerning how some distal intention is to be executed). Even if we can provide a broadly functionalist account of intentions that does not require their being conscious, Mele is sanguine about the possibility that whatever those functional roles are, they might well be supplemented or enhanced by consciousness in distinctive ways. At any rate, the idea is an intriguing one, and merits considerable discussion among philosophers, psychologists, and neuroscientists.

There is a good deal more to this compact book, but I will confine the remainder of my remarks to two things: (1) doubts about whether Mele has accurately characterized the full source and force of willusionist worries, and (2) some ruminations about whether the dialectical success of the book undercuts the effectiveness of Mele’s project in some surprising ways.

Consider the purported threat of neuroscience, as portrayed by willusionists. Although the particular details differ by account, there is a widely shared core to the threat. What I am calling “the core threat” emerges in, for example, Libet’s work. Libet is widely cited partly because he and his colleagues purport to show that the brain “decides” to act considerably before subjects report forming an intention to so act. This might be worrisome in its own terms. Inasmuch as it is, Mele gets the better of the debate. He argues that there is virtually no evidence to suggest that the brain activity that Libet identifies as the brain’s “deciding” is, in fact a decision or an intention to act. Mele goes on to show that the purported “brain decision” is more accurately characterized as the advent of items in the PPG (the preproximal-intention group), such as urges to act or to prepare to act, or “brain events suitable for being proximal causal contributors to such urges, motor preparation, and motor imagery” (56). So, if the threat is really one having to do with, roughly, the temporal location of decidings, then Mele has provided a compelling response.

However, one might think that this is to misconstrue the primary force of the experimental data. Perhaps the core threat arises from the bare fact that there are neurological antecedents to conscious decisions. Something like this concern may be what Libet means to express when he asks, “How could the ‘conscious self’ initiate a voluntary act if, factually, the process to ‘act now’ is initiated unconsciously?” (quoted in Mele 69). On this construal, whether or not the brain “decides” to do something in advance of our conscious sense of deliberation or intention-formation is tangential to the core of the worry. What is really at stake is whether our conscious intentions, even given some role in the production of action, can be picked out of the causal nexus and treated as “special” or free.

To his credit, Mele addresses something like this worry. He writes:

Processes have parts, and the various parts of a process may have more and less proximal initiators. A process that is initiated by an item in the PPG may have a subsequent part that is directly initiated by a consciously made decision. The conscious self — which need not be understood as something mysterious — might more proximally initiate a voluntary act that is less proximally initiated by an item in the PPG. Readers who, like me, prefer to use ‘self’ only as an affix may prefer to say that the acquisition or formation of a relevant proximal intention — and specifically, an intention that is consciously acquired or formed — might more proximally initiate an intentional action that is less proximally initiated by an item in the PPG (69).

What Mele rightly notes is that causal chains can have earlier and later links, and the fact that there are causes of the result very early in that chain does not exclude their being genuine causes of the same result located later in the chain. This reply is good, as far as it goes. I am not convinced it answers the core of the threat, though. Indeed, it might seem to merely constitute part of a fuller statement of the worry. I say this because the willusionists seem to be implicitly working with something like the following picture: When we hold ourselves or others responsible, when we treat people as free, we think we are justified in doing so precisely because we believe that the causal buck stops, in the relevant sense, with the agent. Mele could (and does, I think) agree with this much. What Libet and like-minded folks seem to have in mind, though, is the thought that Libet’s results show that in the relevant sense the causal buck doesn’t stop with the agent.

It is not always clear what Libet and like-minded willusionists think “buck-stopping in the relevant sense” comes to. To be sure, they never attempt to spell out why they think some, rather than another, sense of buck-stopping counts as the relevant one for free will. In contrast, Mele has written a couple of books on free will where he has spelled out why he thinks the relevant buck stops in various places.3 Hence in the larger scheme of things Mele clearly has the better of the dialectical situation. Still, I think the willusionist worry lingers.

Here is a diagnosis: willusionists are sometimes motivated by what the philosophical literature labels as “source” intuitions - the idea that for us to act with a free will we must be the ultimate origins of strands of the causal nexus. On one way of putting things, source theorists think that free acts cannot have causal antecedents that extend back in time prior to the decisions of the agent or the agent’s free formulation of the relevant characterlogical inputs to that decision. I do not mean to defend the view. However, I take it that this view is the engine that drives many willusionists. If this is right, though, then when Mele points out that we can think of action initiation as having lots of parts, some more and less proximal, it will sound to Libet and other proto“source” theorists as though he is essentially conceding the point that the causal buck doesn’t stop with the agent.

It is important to recognize that this worry is not the conventional bogeyman of determinism. Indeed, I suspect that for many neuroscientific willusionists, much of the worry about buck-stopping agency derives from a neuroscience-influenced picture on which we are entirely composed of complicated bits of biology and chemistry operating on principles settled by the lower-level entities.4 If this is right, then it is the broadly reductionistic element that generates the core of the willusionist worry, independently of whether determinism is a threat. Acknowledging that our actions have causal roots in pre-conscious brain activity, as Mele does, just highlights the fact of our causal embeddedness. It does nothing to block the basic worry of how we could be the kinds of beings that stop the buck enough to count as free, or as deserving of moral praise and blame.

Admittedly, I am putting a lot of words into the mouths of willusionists. Libet, Wegner, and the like never offer any reason why we should accept the conception(s) of free will presumed by their accounts. They certainly never explicitly articulate the worry from neuroscience in terms of a threat from reductionism. They almost never give direct expression to worries about buck-stopping. Still, I think those elements are lurking just under the surface of many willusionist accounts. Inasmuch as Mele is endeavoring to defang the bite of willusionists, though, it seems to me he needs to say something about when we rightly count the causal process as starting, at least for the purposes of attributing free will and the like.

Unfortunately, what Mele does say about these issues in this book does little to address the basic worry. He writes:

Did the process of my baking a frozen pizza begin when I turned my oven on to preheat it, when I opened the door of the heated oven five minutes later, when I placed the pizza on the center rack, when I subsequently closed the oven door, or at some other time? Theorists can argue about this, but I prefer not to. Nor do I care to stipulate a starting point in the process (68).

In short, Mele simply sidesteps the matter. Doing so, however, comes at a cost. In the context of grappling with both the literal and implicit force of willusionist claims, it seems to me that the business of when particular action processes properly start does matter a good deal.

This is hardly the last word on these issues and I look forward to hearing more from Mele on these matters in his future work. Before concluding, however, I wish to remark on the potential impact of the book.

Readers familiar with Mele’s other books will find all his usual virtues on display here. Mele has a keen eye for distinction-making, and he offers careful, even exhaustive discussions of the various ways one might refine his interlocutors’ views. He goes on to provide a thoughtful exploration of multiple arguments for and against nearly every substantive thesis relevant to the main topics of the book. In short, this is a book written by a philosopher for philosophers. Precisely because of this, I suspect that the book is likely to stifle the sort of interactions between philosophers and neuroscientists that Mele thinks ought to be fostered. Why? Among philosophers, Mele’s compelling refutation of most of the willusionists’ philosophically interesting claims may count as the codification of what’s wrong with contemporary neuroscience that pretends to a philosophy of action. For better or for worse, refutations of something that are as thorough as Effective Intentions tend to work as conversation-stoppers. Among neuroscientists, though, the book is likely to be passed over precisely because of its conceptual intricacy. The lessons it contains are carefully earned and often require working through distinctions that will be unfamiliar to most neuroscientists. It is, I’m afraid, likely to read by non-philosophers as so much dancing on the head of the pre-proximal intention group. This would be a real shame, for the book is exactly the opposite of the stereotype of a philosophical monograph. It is deeply engaged with empirical matters and its contents are relevant to more than a small subfield in philosophy.

Whatever its wider reception proves to be, Effective Intentions is indisputably the most careful and sophisticated discussion to date of the relevance of neuroscience for our understanding of willing, and especially, whether that willing is free or conscious. It is necessary reading for anyone interested in the neuroscience of agency and free will, and it deserves to be widely read by both philosophers and neuroscientists.5

1 There were, of course, exceptions. For example, Robert Kane famously appealed to some neuroscience-inspired models in his landmark 1996 book (Kane, Robert. 1996. The Significance of Free Will. Oxford: Oxford UP), and Patricia Churchland has argued that neuroscience can cast light on the free will problem (Churchland, Patricia. 2002. Brainwise. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press). More than 20 years ago, Ted Honderich adopted a form of skepticism about free will partly on the basis of neuroscience (Honderich, Ted. 1988. A Theory of Determinism. New York: Oxford UP). Despite these visible exceptions, until relatively recently the bulk of the field seemed to find little of use in contemporary neuroscience.

2 The credit for inventing this wonderful label goes to Eddy Nahmias.

3 For Mele’s most recent book on these matters, see Mele, Alfred. 2006. Free Will and Luck. New York: Oxford UP.

4 A number of other thinkers have noted that this may be the best interpretation of why neuroscience is threatening. Among the most notable are Nahmias, Eddy, D. Justin Coates, and Trevor Kvaran. 2007. “Free Will, Moral Responsibility, and Mechanism: Experiments on Folk Intuitions.” Midwest Studies in Philosophy XXXI 214-41; and Murphy, Nancey and Warren S. Brown. 2007. Did My Neurons Make Me Do it? New York: Oxford UP.

5 Thanks to Nadeem Hussain for a helpful discussion on some issues connected to this review.