Efficient Causation: A History

Placeholder book cover

Tad M. Schmaltz (ed.), Efficient Causation: A History, Oxford University Press, 2014, 372pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199782178.

Reviewed by John Grey, Michigan State University


Philosophers are drawn to causation like moths. The reason seems to be that causation is one of the precious few relations fit to serve as explanation; in many domains, to understand a phenomenon just is to know its cause. How much better, then, to understand causation itself! The problem -- well, one problem -- is that there are so very many wildly disparate cases that are thought to be instances of causation. Here's where moth meets flame. An account of causation in general must, on the face of it, be able to handle all of the many kinds of causation. A pool ball strikes another, causing it to move; my failing to water the plant causes it to wilt; your willing to imagine an elephant causes your imagining of the elephant; and on and on.

Many metaphysicians see in this a reason to seek a conceptual analysis of causation. There is something that unifies what David Lewis calls the "gruesomely disjunctive miscellany" of cases of causation, and conceptual analysis is required to identify that unifying factor.[1] Historians of philosophy, by contrast, may suspect that miscellany gives us reason to try to understand causation not by way of analysis, but by way of genealogy. Indeed (our historians might suspect) the genealogy of our concept of causation is likely to have involved so many circuitous twists and turns, taken for reasons that we would consider metaphysically irrelevant or arbitrary, that we might well find ourselves disenchanted with the project of analyzing it. Still, even in the absence of a satisfying conceptual analysis, a conceptual genealogy could provide us with a deeper philosophical understanding of the target concept.

Efficient Causation is a genealogy of this sort -- a history of the concept of causation as it finds broad use today, and an attempt to cultivate a deeper understanding of that concept without any pretense at analyzing it. The guiding thought behind the volume is that there is a developmental story to tell here that is both philosophically informative and surprisingly nuanced. For instance, although it would be a mistake to "identify Aristotle's own concept of efficient causation with the concept of this sort of causality that emerged during the High Middle Ages", nevertheless we may "see the latter as deriving in a crucial sense from the former" (6). Working out this developmental story is a way of getting at one sort of explanation (a causal explanation!) of the miscellany of cases we today count as instances of causation. Toward that end, the volume includes eleven essays about the concept of efficient causation -- or what we now simply call "causation" -- as it figured in different periods in the history of philosophy.

As the flagship entry in the Oxford Philosophical Concepts series, another feature bears mention. Aside from the scholarly essays on different historical periods, the volume also includes four relatively brief "Reflections," short essays on the notion of efficient causation as it pertains to art, science, and culture, broadly construed. According to the series editor, Christia Mercer, the aim of the Reflections is to "display the benefits of using philosophical concepts and distinctions in areas that are not strictly philosophical, and encourage philosophers to move beyond the borders of their discipline as presently conceived" (xiv).

The volume's goals are thus quite broad. On the one hand, it is intended to set out a genealogy of a concept that continues to occupy a central role in a wide range of philosophical debates, and to do so in a way that serves to inform such debates going forward. On the other hand, it is also intended to spark philosophical interest in (traditionally) non-philosophical uses of the concept of efficient causation. Does the volume achieve these big-picture goals? Yes, for the most part. The quality of the scholarship is very high without being unapproachable, the volume lays out a detailed and insightful history of its target concept, and the Reflections are engaging and thought provoking. The volume's primary flaws are only those endemic to any project with so broad a purpose: in telling such a grand story in such a small amount of space, some philosophically interesting parts of the story get short shrift.

The volume has many strengths, one of which is that it can profitably be read from cover to cover as a single sustained work in the history of philosophy. The volume itself does not provide a summary of the key historical shifts in its target concept; the editor's introduction follows the convention of providing brief summaries of each individual essay. However, the volume is organized and written well enough that it is easy to trace the key historical movements regarding any particular aspect of the metaphysics of causation that might be of interest.

This point can be illustrated by connecting the dots among the various essays with regard to a particular topic in the metaphysics of causation. For instance, we might wish to know about historical approaches to the question: What kinds of entity can be efficient causes?

In Aristotle's view, an efficient cause of some motion (or, more generally, of some change) is "where the motion first comes from" (26). So, as Thomas Tuozzo explains, supposing a hot stone is placed in a small amount of cool water and the water gradually becomes warm, the stone's heat is the efficient cause of the water's becoming warm (29-31). The stone's heat is a power (one of the causal relata) and the water's becoming warm is the change or motion it produces (the other relatum). These powers could either be natural, as in the case of the stone's heat, or rational, as in the case of a person's choosing to build a house.

Philosophers after Aristotle, until the late medieval period, tended either to emphasize the natural at the expense of the rational or vice versa. R. J. Hankinson argues that in the Stoic tradition, efficient causation is taken to be a relation between physical bodies and attributes (or predicates, the Stoics apparently not much concerned with the distinction).[2] But in their more careful moments, he argues, the Stoics hold that causation is best construed as a polyadic relation connecting bodies as well as the attributes of bodies, of the form: "a's being G is a cause to b of b's being F" (65). The Stoic emphasis on bodies and their attributes as efficient causes was not to last long. Ian Wilks argues that, in Late Antiquity, the rise of Platonist metaphysics (for example, in the writings of Plotinus and Proclus) combined with Christian theology leads to the downfall of the view that bodies could be the locus of causal powers. The alternative view is that "A body is by nature something to be acted on, a passive recipient of action", while the incorporeal is "something that by nature acts" (85).

The thesis that only spirits can be efficient causes is tempered somewhat in the later medieval period -- for instance, as Kara Richardson observes, Avicenna offers an account of efficient causation intended to include both "creative and natural agents" (111), as does Aquinas. The thesis finally reappears in full force in the writings of Malebranche and Berkeley. However, Lisa Downing argues, "neither Malebranche nor Berkeley rules out corporeal causes by . . . simply appealing to a notion of efficient causation that is inflected with finality and which therefore allows only volitions to be causes" (199). Rather, they justify the view by appeal to an analysis of the concept of body: just by examining that concept, we find that bodies can ground neither necessary connections, as Malebranche argues (205-13), nor active powers, as Berkeley argues (225-26), and so cannot be efficient causes.

Later in the modern period, this kind of concern about whether bodies, or only spirits, can be causes is abandoned in the face of the Humean conception of causation as constant conjunction. P. J. E. Kail characterizes the historic moment: "Goodbye to influxus, final causation, trope transfer, agency, and all other attempts to articulate the metaphysics of causation. Hello to the austere view that all causation is efficient causation, and efficacy is reduced to constant conjunction" (232). By accounting for causation in terms of constant conjunction, questions of activity and passivity of causal relata are set aside, and hence the question as to whether bodies can be causes may be trivially resolved. Whether active or passive, surely bodies can be involved in constant conjunctions. Insofar as we have inherited this Humean picture, the only questions that remain about the nature of causal relata have to do with their logical type: is it best to consider causation a relation between objects, events, facts, or what?

Yet, as a couple of the contributing authors observe, there was (and is) some resistance to this austere Humean view. Eric Watkins argues that the Third Analogy in Kant's Critique of Pure Reason "strongly suggests the kind of model [of causation] that involves substances acting by way of their causal powers or forces" (274). Watkins takes Kant to be offering this explicitly as a rival to the Humean model. Likewise, Stephen Mumford discusses a family of more recent dispositionalist approaches to causation, according to which we should understand "the world in terms of causal powers rather than . . . built up from events" (339), a view that Mumford relates back to Aristotle's original treatment of causation. The volume announces no victor in the contemporary debate about this topic, appropriately enough, but it is striking that the views Mumford discusses in the very last chapter of the volume bring us back to the sort of approach we found in the very first.

This is the story of just one aspect of causation that can be found in the volume, but there are many other topics that the volume handles equally well. Aside from the topic just discussed, for example, those interested in the principle of sufficient reason -- roughly speaking, the principle that everything has an explanation -- will find much of interest. Several of the essays touch on how the principle influenced philosophical understanding of causation in different historical periods. (Kara Richardson's excellent treatment of Avicenna's metaphysical rationalism bears special mention in this regard.)

The flaws of the volume are, as mentioned above, only those we might expect to find in such a far-reaching project. In attempting to recount causation's complex history, the volume leaves out some topics one might have hoped it would discuss. Perhaps the most significant absence is its relative silence regarding shifts in the relationship between causation and explanation throughout the history of philosophy. This absence is lamentable since, as mentioned at the outset, it is causation's role in explanation that gives it the prized status it has in philosophy.

Here is an example of an issue falling under this general rubric that the volume might have been expected to engage with. One fascinating and challenging possibility is that causation is ultimately just not that important to explaining or even understanding the world. On this view, in spite of the philosophical fetish for analyses of causation, at the end of the day our best scientific theories won't involve any causal claims at all. The historian of science Stillman Drake finds this view in Galileo.[3] Both Bertrand Russell and, more recently, John Norton have also endorsed versions of it.[4] Moreover, it is a possibility that a history of the concept of causation is extremely well suited to investigating, for its emergence as a viable philosophical view seems to have depended upon historical shifts in our conceptions of explanation and science. The volume does not touch on it at all.

That example illustrates a more general tendency the volume has to deal in great detail with the history of the metaphysics of causation without going into similar depth regarding the epistemology. The volume barely touches on epistemological issues regarding causation, and only in a couple of unsurprising places: Kail's entry on Hume and Watkins' entry on Kant. Further, in both cases, epistemology is only brought up in service to metaphysics. (E.g., Kail: "Once we understand how causation figures in inference we then grasp better what we represent by the concept" (236).) Treating epistemology as the handmaiden of metaphysics puts a certain slant on the story. Metaphysicians and historians of metaphysics will love the result -- all of the good stuff without any of the nervous hand-wringing! -- but it may also leave many philosophers and historians of science a bit cold.

Nevertheless, the volume succeeds admirably in its stated goals. As Schmaltz rightly notes in his introduction, "even with respect to the history of philosophy, there can be no claim here to have told the complete story of the concept(s) of efficient causation" (19). Even the volume's subtitle reminds us of this with its use of the indefinite article: we are being given a history, not the history. Consequently, the fact that the volume ignores some important philosophical issues surrounding its target concept is not much of a black mark. It may even serve to highlight one of the advantages that examining a concept by way of its history seems to have over examining it by way of analysis. When a philosopher accepts a particular conceptual analysis of a concept, this implicitly commits her to rejecting different analyses of that concept. But when a philosopher accepts a particular historical account of a concept, there is no such implicit commitment to rejecting different genealogies of that same concept. Efficient Causation is a historical account of our concept of causation, but it makes no claim to being the only possible history, or even the only philosophically salient history, of that concept.

Efficient Causation is a history of causation written for metaphysicians. By those lights, it is excellent.


Galilei, Galileo. Two New Sciences: Including Centers of Gravity and Force of Percussion, second edition, trans. Stillman Drake. (Toronto: Wall and Thompson, 1989).

Lewis, David. "Causation as Influence." In Causation and Counterfactuals, eds. John Collins, Ned Hall, and L. A. Paul. (Cambridge: MIT Press, 2004).

Norton, John D. "Causation as Folk Science." Philosophers' Imprint, vol. 3, no. 4 (November 2003): 1-22.

Russell, Bertrand. "On the Notion of Cause." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, vol. 13 (1912-13): 1-26.

[1] Lewis, "Causation as Influence," 76.

[2] This is not a dig at Hankinson -- he notes the "apparent indifference with which the Stoics seem to switch between categorizing effects as attributes and as predicates, lekta" (63).

[3] See Drake's introduction to his translation of Galileo’s Two New Sciences, xxxiv-v. Drake also holds that a similar view is expressed in Heinrich Hertz’s Principles of Mechanics.

[4] In "On the Notion of Cause," Russell writes, "the reason why physics has ceased to look for causes is that, in fact, there are no such things" (1). In "Causation as Folk Science," Norton advances the weaker view that, "At a fundamental level, there are no causes and effects in science and no overarching principle of causality" (21, emphasis added).