Egocentricity and Mysticism: An Anthropological Study

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Ernst Tugendhat, Egocentricity and Mysticism: An Anthropological Study, Alexei Procyshyn and Mario Wenning (trs.), Columbia University Press, 2016, 163pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231169127.

Reviewed by Ursula Renz, Alpen-Adria-Universität Klagenfurt


This is the third book by Ernst Tugendhat that has been translated into English. Though perhaps not the most important of his works, it is certainly more illuminating than any other text when it comes to exhibiting the implications of his thought. Well known for his Traditional and Analytic Philosophy: Lectures on the Philosophy of Language (1982, originally 1976), his Self-Consciousness and Self-Determination (1986, originally 1979) as well as his Vorlesungen über Ethik (1993), Tugendhat returns with Egocentricity and Mysticism (2016, originally 2003) to the existential beginnings of his philosophical biography,[1] which he now seeks to spell out in the idiom of analytical philosophy.

But Tugendhat displays also a critical attitude towards the aspirations of his youth, in particular by suggesting an anthropological approach to mysticism. Rather than simply a matter of method, this is a clear statement regarding the foundation of any reflection on the meaning of life. As is explicitly expressed in the title of his later volume Anthropologie statt Metaphysik (2007), consisting of a collection of talks Tugendhat gave in the aftermath of Egocentricity and Mysticism, it is his contention that anthropology must replace metaphysics in all its traditional functions.

This entails that both the foundations of and connections between the otherwise compartmentalized philosophical sub-disciplines are provided by anthropological insights. "Since", Tugendhat writes in the Addendum, "the somersaults of ontology and transcendental philosophy are no longer convincing, the question as to how we should understand ourselves as human beings takes center stage" (p. 136). Conceptions of humankind are thus to constitute the backbone of what previously has been called 'philosophical systems' in German philosophy.

More importantly, the substitution of metaphysics (and transcendental philosophy) sets principal limits to any speculation about the roots of mystical experience. It requires that one merely engage with psychological causes or motivations of humans' search or need for mysticism, while keeping silent about its metaphysical foundations. However, Tugendhat not only abstains from taking any sort of ontological or transcendental ground of mysticism into consideration, but also rejects any concern of this kind as due to a lack of "intellectual honesty".[2] Rather than just being meant to foster an agnostic attitude, Tugendhat's anthropological approach is intended to support some sort of reductionist naturalism.

One might regret this stance, as many did, when the book first appeared in German.[3] Yet, I shall not invoke these concerns again. Instead, I rather want to show that -- even within the field of philosophical anthropology -- Tugendhat's reflections on man's self-concern cover a very special territory, the choice of which deserves more attention than it has received so far. The primary aim of this review is thus to lay bare some of the philosophical decisions underlying Tugendhat's anthropological approach and to illuminate how they shape his views. Against this background, I hope, it becomes more questionable whether one really has to share Tugendhat's somewhat sad outlook on men's striving for a meaningful life.

The book is divided into two complementary parts. In Part One, which itself consists of five very rich chapters, Tugendhat presents the anthropological pillars of his approach; in Part Two he shows how, on the basis of his anthropology, mysticism and religion (Chapter 6) as well as the phenomenon of wonder (Chapter 7) are to be understood. As I locate the importance of the book in its anthropology, rather than in the proposed views on mysticism, I shall hereafter concentrate on the first part.

Tugendhat begins his study with a brief sketch of his views on the semantic roots of human thought and self-consciousness as put forward already in Traditional and Analytic Philosophy and Self-Consciousness and Self-Determination. Readers familiar with Tugendhat's previous works will recognize many of the claims put forward; yet he now presents them in an anthropological framework which sheds new light on them.

Following Tugendhat, it is in virtue of the special properties of human language, such as its predicative structure, the availability of various moods, or the possibility of negation -- all features of the propositionality of human language -- that man departs from other animals (p. 5). This not only explains why man can take a stance with regard to facts, instead of merely responding to them as contextual stimuli, but, as Tugendhat maintains, it is also a constitutive factor of all facets of human rationality. Far from merely exhibiting the capacity to affirm or negate given facts, propositional language enables man to deliberate on all sorts of matters. Tugendhat thus dissociates himself from those pragmatist tendencies in philosophical anthropology that emphasize the communicative roots of human language, and draws attention instead to its extracommunicative function (p. 6).

This -- call it 'anti-pragmatist' -- point of departure is crucial, for it is also basic for the conception of human egocentricity at work in the book. Relying on earlier analyses of singular terms and, in particular, deictic and indexical expressions, Tugendhat claims that any act of saying 'I' requires that the speaker has grasped that "when he says 'I', [he] refers to himself" (p. 11). Tugendhat here follows Sidney Shoemaker's famous claim that acts of self-reference are usually immune to error through misidentification. And not surprisingly, he continues his discussion by exposing the connection of this point with another of Shoemaker's claims, namely that self-knowledge, or knowledge of one's own states, is marked by some sort of immediacy (p. 13).

That said, Tugendhat nonetheless radically denies the existence of an inner realm, a self, or a subject which may be investigated independently of the rules governing the usage of the pronoun 'I'. Instead, he considers human subjectivity to be a result of man's acquisition of propositional language. "With predicative language", he writes, "there arises at the same time [in eins] the awareness of other objects and of oneself as an object among others . . . " (p. 16, Tugendhat's emphasis). Hence, far from being grounded in the experiential perspective of the first person, man's egocentricity or self-centeredness only arises with man's capacity to refer to things in a context-independent manner. Or at least this is what Tugendhat's semantic account of it suggests.

Having presented his conception of what makes us human, Tugendhat discusses in Chapter 2 man's capacity for practical deliberation. He begins by examining what function the value terms "good" and "important" have for our life. Drawing on the supposed insight into the semantic foundation of human thought, Tugendhat first aligns man's capacity to refer to something as "good" with the context-independence of propositional language in general (p. 20). Propositional language enables I-sayers to articulate and envisage abstract goals, which is why they can weight long-term goals higher than their sensuous desires. In addition, man's overall orientation is also shaped by the term "important", by which things are designated as valuable for someone (p. 28).

Tugendhat complements this semantic analysis with an ontogenetic explanation of how people acquire the notion of importance. It is, he claims, by being loved and thus acknowledged as important for someone that children learn what it means for a thing to be important. He concludes: "That means, first, that in order to take something to be important in general, I-sayers must take themselves to be important, and, second, in order to be able to take themselves thus, they need to know that they are important to others" (p. 30). It is thus the term "important" that brings man's self-centeredness to the fore, yet, together with the term "good", it also enables us to step back from ourselves in various ways. We can step back from a given affective impulse or desire in favor of some future good; or we can relativize our egoistic concerns by taking another's wellbeing to be equally important to our own; or, finally, we can become aware of the insignificance of ourselves and our worries by conceiving of our smallness in relation to the universe (p. 25f., 30).

Chapter 3 addresses the problem of human agency and responsibility. Revisiting Tyler Burge's claim that these concepts derive from the notion that I-saying allows man to posit himself as the author of his own thoughts,[4] Tugendhat points to the self-mobilizing effects of I-speech. He affirms Burge's contention that in considering an event as one of my actions or as an object of my deliberate intent, I commit myself to the view that, to a certain extent, its success "is up to me". But for Tugendhat this is not a matter of a relation between the concept of the first person and the idea of responsibility, nor does it suggest that our intentions are subject to deliberate choice. Instead, he thinks, it exhibits the psychological fact "that I-sayers are capable of relating to a good more or less strongly" (p. 41). And this relation, he further assumes, can even be reinforced by the very thought "it is up to me", for in this thought "I am . . . confronted with myself" (p. 45). Tugendhat concludes by pointing out that this "capacity for self-mobilization", again, goes along with the capacity for propositional language; it is, he says, "a veritable biological phenomenon of our species" (p. 46).

Chapter 4 proposes a new understanding of the social foundation of ethics in general and of the virtue of intellectual honesty in particular. Elaborating on the idea of adverbial goodness, Tugendhat points out that in order to qualify a given activity as "well performed", we must already dispose of a context-independent conceptual spectrum of doing something well or better, as merely situation-relative criteria of correctness do not allow for comparative judgment of performance (p. 51). Tugendhat further claims that the idea of moral good must be comprehended as a special case of the adverbial good, namely that case by which we judge how well persons act with respect to the reciprocal demands established in a community (p. 53f.). He concludes that any aspiration to do well and, hence, the very idea of adverbial good, is grounded in recognition (where recognition is not, as in his previous analysis, a matter of being important to someone, but of being acknowledged as good, i.e. of being respected for one's actions; compare pp. 29 and 56). However, he emphasizes, the idea of adverbial good is not exhausted by our need for factual recognition. Rehearsing, instead, Adam Smith' famous distinction between being praised and being praiseworthy, he contends that we may attempt to perform actions in a praiseworthy manner and thus step back from our striving for praise. This distinction also sets the stage for Tugendhat's discussion of the virtue of intellectual honesty, which he defines as the attitude in virtue of which "a person does not pretend to know more than he really knows" (p. 61), a definition he eventually takes to ground his position against the notion of God or other transcendent realities.[5]

It is only in Chapter 5, which addresses man's relation to life and death, that Tugendhat takes up his previous claim that "both the adverbial good and the moral good must have a place . . . within the prudential good, or else they would not motivate anyone" (p. 54f.). He begins by voicing the view that "The expression 'prudential good' is at first simply a formula . . . for everything that a human being cares about on the whole" (p. 69). He argues that what unifies our several concerns consists in the affective condition in which we find ourselves even before we explicitly reflect about our lives (p. 71f.). Remarkably, this attitude, by which I-sayers relate to their own existence, is characterized as a result of a passive confrontation with one's life as a whole, which means that the implicit evaluations entailed in our condition merely express the causal impact of the drives constituting our affective life, but they are not derived from deliberation on the importance of given concerns.

As I-sayers, so Tugendhat argues, we can transform this condition in different ways. On the one hand, we can bring the various goods we are confronted with into an order of importance (p. 73). On the other hand, we can raise "the more fundamental practical question in which this 'me' is being problematized", i.e. we can reflect upon how we want to or should understand ourselves or -- what is the same for Tugendhat -- deliberate on how we want to or should live (p. 74). This is a remarkable equation. Note that Tugendhat does not simply assume here that the improvement of self-understanding is of practical relevance. Nor does he point out that, from a transcendental point of view, to act as a moral subject requires some level of self-understanding. Rather, he claims that what I look for when I wonder how to comprehend myself is eventually an answer to the question of the good life.

One may question this contention. To speak for myself, I neither see my personal attempts at getting a better grasp of myself so far as being immediately concerned with the conception of a good life, nor do I think of my philosophical interest in the issue of self-knowledge as being practical in this sense. Still, it has to be emphasized that this contention is quite in line with two characteristic points of Tugendhat's anthropological approach.

Recalling, first, how radically he has previously rejected the notion of a self or of an inner realm, this move is nothing but consistent. Second, and more important, the mentioned equation reflects an overall tendency of the book. We have seen that Tugendhat attaches a lot of importance to the notion that human existence is shaped, essentially as it were, by propositional language, and he demonstrates, convincingly I think, that many of the basic features characterizing human moral life and thought can be explained by this hypothesis. Note, however, that this very same anthropological tenet could also be employed to make sense of man's theoretical or contemplative aspirations. Strikingly, there is no mention of this option at all, despite Tugendhat's explicit emphasis of the extracommunicative aspects of propositional language. The question arises: provided this point of departure, why should we not ascribe to men a genuinely theoretical interest in the world and the objects it contains as well, and assume that this interest, albeit reaching beyond merely practical concerns, is quite as characteristic for human existence as the capacity for practical deliberation?

While this more intellectualistic outlook on human existence may seem compatible, in principle, with Tugendhat's anthropological point of departure, it is certainly at odds with his outlook on religion and mysticism as they are discussed in Part Two. There, more than merely addressing mysticism from an anthropological point of view, Tugendhat refuses to take the phenomenological contents of either religious or mystical experience very seriously. It is noteworthy that taking them more seriously would not involve withdrawal from his naturalist point of view, or at least not necessarily so. Yet, it would run counter to his view that both the life of our species and that of human individuals are essentially shaped by desires and deliberate intentions, rather than by doxastic attitudes such as convictions. Strangely, though, Tugendhat concludes with a short and lovely chapter on the phenomenon of wonder, where, among other things, he argues that Descartes was right in positing an emotion that is not reducible to our concern with things insofar as they are good or bad for us, but insofar as they exist (p. 129).

To summarize, what I find most controversial about Tugendhat's approach is not that he discusses mysticism from an anthropological perspective. Indeed, I am quite sympathetic with the basic claim of his anthropology. However, there is just no need to elaborate this claim in the way he does. This shows that Tugendhat's views on what makes up human existence rely on a sort of voluntarist picture (which is, I guess, of Heideggerian heritage) that one does not have to accept. There is the option of describing man's relation to all: himself, other things in the world, the world as a whole and even human life as whole, in terms other than those which practical deliberation provides us with. Having in mind, e.g., certain systems of classical rationalism, we can expect that taking man's epistemic ties with reality more seriously would yield an outlook on man's place in the world that is perhaps also somewhat more optimistic with regard to man's striving for meaning in life. I am perhaps pretty much alone in this expectation in the context of the academic philosophy of our times. Yet, I have a hard time, as a philosopher, not thinking of knowledge, or rather some sort of knowledge, as being inherently rewarding.

Let me briefly address another concern. Rereading Tugendhat's book more than ten years after its publication, I was puzzled by the way in which he frames his views on the intersubjective roots of morals. Notably, it was the absence of any mention of the second-person perspective that struck me most. Whereas Tugendhat relies in many places on phenomena associated with the second person such as reactive feelings or different layers of recognition, he never invokes the idea nowadays associated with the second-person standpoint, not to mention accounts of the irreducibility of the second-person to the third-person-standpoint. Having been written before Stephen Darwall's seminal book on this issue, Tugendhat's book cannot be expected to take this issue more seriously.[6] Still, I regretted this in many places and wondered whether he might not have arrived at a different outlook, an outlook that, while deriving from another source than the one I just sketched in the previous paragraph, would also provide us with a possibility for overcoming anthropological egocentrism other than the several notions of stepping-back that Tugendhat discusses.

It goes without saying that, notwithstanding these concerns, Tugendhat's study is full of philosophical insight into all its three domains of philosophical concern: philosophical anthropology, ethics, and philosophy of religion.


I would like to thank Kathrin Hönig, Paul Lodge, Sarah Tropper and Zachary Gartenberg for their comments on an earlier version of this review.


Bonheim, Günther. "Zur Rezeption von Egozentrizität und Mystik". In Mystik, Religion und intellektuelle Redlichkeit. Nachdenken über Thesen Ernst Tugendhats, ed. Klaus Jacobi: 151-158. Karl Alber, 2012, 151-158.

Burge, Tyler. "Reason and the First Person". In Knowing Our Own Minds, ed. Crispin Wright et. el. Clarendon, 1998, 243-270.

Darwall, Stephen. The Second-Person Standpoint. Morality, Respect, and Accountability. Harvard University Press, 2006.

Henrich, Dieter. "Mystik ohne Subjektivität?" In Deutsche Zeitschrift für Philosophie 54 (2006), 169-188.

Hesse, Michael. "Philosoph Ernst Tugendhat wird 85: 'Es wird zu viel geschwafelt'". In Berliner Zeitung, 03/06/2015 (last access 01/05/2017).

Jacobi, Klaus (ed.). Mystik, Religion und intellektuelle Redlichkeit. Nachdenken über Thesen Ernst Tugendhats. Karl Alber, 2012.

Skirke, Christian. Review of Egozentrizität und Mystik: Eine anthropologische Studie. In European Journal of Philosophy 13 (2005), 306-11.

Strawson, P.F. "Freedom and Resentment". In Freedom and Resentment and Other Essays. Routledge, 1968, 1-28.

Tugendhat, Ernst. Traditional and Analytic Philosophy: Lectures on the Philosophy of Language. Trans. P.A. Gorner. Cambridge University Press, 1982.

-- Self-Consciousness and Self-Determination. Trans. Paul Stern. MIT Press, 1986.

-- Vorlesungen über Ethik. Suhrkamp, 1993.

-- Egozentrizität und Mystik. Eine anthropologische Studie. Beck, 2003.

-- Anthropologie statt Metaphysik. Beck, 2007.

[1] In a portrait published on the occasion of his eighty-fifth birthday in the Berliner Zeitung, Tugendhat said, "Für mich war die Konfrontation mit 'Sein und Zeit' schon sehr früh, als ich 15 war, prägend. Das hat mich überhaupt erst zur Philosophie gebracht." Compare Hesse 2015.

[2] This critique is voiced more bluntly in his "Retraktationen zur intellektuellen Redlichkeit", which makes up the fourth chapter of Anthropologie statt Metaphysik (compare Tugendhat 2007, 85-113, p. 112f.). See note 4 for more details.

[3] For objections against Tugendhat's views on religion and mysticism, see the translator's introduction and the papers in Jacobi 2012; for a fundamental critique of the neglect of transcendental philosophy, see Henrich 2006. An overview on the reception of Egocentricity and Mysticism is contained in Bonheim 2012.

[4] That this is perhaps not the most natural choice has been emphasized by Skirke 2005, p. 308.

[5] As already mentioned, Tugendhat is more blunt about this in his "Retrakationen über intellektuelle Redlichkeit", contained in his Anthropologie statt Metaphysik (Tugendhat 2007, pp. 85-113). Note that, despite the title of this chapter, Tugendhat's revision of his former views does not touch upon the idea that even intellectual honesty has social roots. Instead, he points out that this virtue must be comprehended in terms of a person's orientation towards the true, rather than the good, and he thus abstains from subsuming people's concern with truth under the notion of the good (p. 94). Yet, as the definition of intellectual honesty as a disposition "to which a person firstly may attach importance in her relation to her own beliefs, and which, secondly, is esteemed in intersubjective exchange" (p. 96) shows, Tugendhat still suggests a recognition-based approach.

[6] Note however that Dieter Henrich assumes that Tugendhat's views on guilt and indignation are derived from Strawson's seminal paper Freedom and Resentment, wherein the importance of the second person is also prominently discussed. Henrich might have some evidence here which I do not have. In any case, Tugendhat never mentions Strawson in this context in Egocentricity and Mystics, and in Self-consciousness and Self-determination, where the intersubjective roots of our self-relation are extensively discussed, it is George Herbert Mead's approach that constitutes Tugendhat's point of reference.