Einstein, Relativity and Absolute Simultaneity

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William Lane Craig and Quentin Smith (eds.), Einstein, Relativity and Absolute Simultaneity, Routledge, 2008, 302pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415701747.

Reviewed by Thomas Ryckman, Stanford University


The subject of this book is clearly stated by its title. The editors, who have squared off previously over creationism and the existence of God, unite here in bringing together "the first collection of essays devoted … to arguing that simultaneity is absolute". The contributors are the editors separately, as well as Craig Callender, Anthony Valentini, Tim Maudlin, Franco Selleri, Tom Van Flandern, Michael Tooley, Richard Swinburne, Thomas M. Crisp, and John Lucas; in short, theologians, physicists, philosophers of physics, philosophers of language and metaphysicians. All the essays appear here for the first time. Differences emerge on the grounds for "absolute simultaneity" and on what it implies. The editors adopt the disputable premise, not necessarily shared by every contributor, that the theory of special relativity rests on a refuted positivist or Machian philosophy of science, culminating in a verificationist analysis of the concepts of space and time.[1] Thus the book targets those "quite mistaken" philosophers "who embrace relativity because they are under the impression that the evidence of physics implies it", as well as physicists who may lack "awareness of the many arguments that philosophers have provided against the epistemology, philosophy of language, and ontology presupposed by" the theory of special relativity. Any attempt to establish cross-disciplinary appeal of this kind is always a daunting challenge. In this reviewer's opinion, the book does not live up to its mandate but does contain a number of papers well worth reading.

The contributions of the physicists are among the most successful. The problem before Valentini ("Hidden variables and the large-scale structure of space-time") is one also addressed by many of the other contributors, viz., rethinking relativistic space-time in light of the quantum non-locality demonstrated by the Bell experiments. Observing that (local) Lorentz invariance, from which relativity of simultaneity is usually regarded a consequence, is "far from being a dogma in the context of high-energy physics or quantum gravity", Valentini turns the table by noting that many working in foundations of quantum mechanics consider Lorentz invariance to be fundamental even though the observed violations of Bell's inequalities provide prima facie evidence for abandoning it. Of course, Lorentz invariance is a bone of contention since Valentini is an advocate of pilot-wave theory (or Bohmian mechanics), where the motion of a particle may depend on the positions of distant particles, even at space-like separation. Valentini has long argued that the Born rule (a postulate of standard quantum mechanics, stating that the probability distribution for outcomes of quantum measurements is proportional to |Ψ|2) is not fundamental but can be derived as the "quantum equilibrium distribution", a convergence to equilibrium result from a "subquantum H-theorem" in analogy with statistical mechanics.

Drawing on earlier results showing that non-equilibrium distributions can be connected with instantaneous signaling between spatially separated systems, Valentini briefly details how in such circumstances, both at the general level of deterministic hidden-variable theories, and then more specifically in de Broglie-Bohm pilot wave theory, non-local signaling is present at the statistical level. He then shows how this conception of absolute simultaneity might be embedded in flat and in curved space-time by being associated with a preferred foliation of space-like 3-surfaces, defining a preferred local state of rest. Alas, there appears to be a conspiracy between relativity and quantum theory in that statistical noise in the universe (the uncertainty principle) prevents us from exploiting this subquantum non-locality to send instantaneous signals. Hence our inability to send superluminal signals is not a law of physics, as special relativity maintains, but a "contingent feature of quantum equilibrium". This raises a theme that recurs throughout the volume: why should anyone place bets on a theory sporting an underlying preferred frame, since (so far as we know) this frame cannot be detected, at least classically? Not all the authors addressing the question here possess Valentini's forthrightness: "From our perspective, for as long as we are confined to a state of statistical equilibrium that hides the underlying non-locality from direct view, it seems probable that the argument [non-locality vs. relativistic space-time] will continue to be unresolved." (p. 151)

The Italian theoretical physicist, Selleri, makes another case for absolute simultaneity from a completely classical perspective ("The zero acceleration discontinuity and absolute simultaneity"). The editor of an acute critical collection of essays in an unfortunately little-noticed book of ten years ago (Open Questions in Relativistic Physics, Montreal, 1999), Selleri begins from the often overlooked point that our knowledge of inertial frames has been obtained in frames possessing some small but non-zero acceleration. Theoretically, an inertial frame strictly exists only in the limit as acceleration goes smoothly, and without discontinuities, to zero. Summarizing previous results, this is shown not to be the case with the existing theories of relativity, with examples of both rotating and linearly accelerating frames (surely, we knew this already in general relativity). Accordingly Selleri specifies a set of "general transformations" between inertial systems satisfying the above requirement of which the Lorentz transformations are a special case.

These "most general transformations of the space and time variable between inertial systems allowed by the continuity condition" yield a "general proof of absolute simultaneity" wherein two events judged simultaneous in an assumed isotropic rest system S0 are similarly judged simultaneous in the relatively moving system S. Moreover he shows that this relation of absolute simultaneity can be exported to any other inertial system S′. While S0 is privileged (here alone Einstein synchronization obtains), it is not experimentally detectable and can be arbitrarily chosen. But its existence enables formulation of a "weak relativity principle" merely affirming the impossibility of measuring the absolute velocity of the earth. Can adherence to such a principle justify Selleri's realism -- "if a theory describes correctly the physical reality, a particular inertial system has to exist in which simultaneity and time are not conventional but truly physical" (p. 184)? This delicate matter is left to the reader.

The astronomer Van Flandern contributes a highly readable essay on "Global Positioning System and the twins' paradox", arguing that GPS is "a practical realization of Lorentz's 'universal time', wherein all clocks remain synchronized despite being in many different frames with high relative speeds". In essence, the GPS system considers one frame, the local gravitational field (read, Lorentzian ether), to be privileged: here alone clocks tick at universal time, lending a new, technology-infused meaning to Lorentzian relativity. However, although Van Flandern doesn't make the point explicitly, this can be Lorentzian relativity in only a Pickwickian sense since the rates of atomic clocks of GPS satellites are re-set prelaunch to compensate for the predicted effects of both special and general relativity. Van Flandern then runs through the familiar twins' paradox, showing that twins with GPS synchronized clocks will agree that the traveling twin returns younger than the one who remains home, removing the paradoxical taint of the thought experiment. Of course, the same conclusion can be consistently obtained in special relativity, but with greater complexity of explanation. On the other hand, unlike the standard special relativistic accounts that appeal to negative and positive accelerations at both onset, return, and the turn-around event, Van Flandern urges that explanation need only consider clock rate changes and time-slippage events, the latter occurring discontinuously when the direction of the traveling twin changes.

Philosophers of physics Callender and Maudlin each address the issue of whether non-local correlations in quantum mechanics require a preferred frame. Callender's essay ("Finding 'real' time in quantum mechanics") takes fundamental issue with "tensers", those who maintain, following Popper, that quantum non-locality unquestionably demonstrates the existence of a preferred frame and the failure of Lorentz invariance. Right away Callender reminds us that whether this is so depends on one's favored interpretation of quantum mechanics. For there are interpretations (such as those that treat the wave function 'instrumentally' or informationally, the Ψ-epistemic interpretation scouted by Harrigan and Spekkens[2], relative-state interpretations, possibly) where non-local correlations do not conflict with Lorentz invariance. On the other hand, one can interpret Lorentz invariance in a non-standard manner (e.g., Gordon Fleming's "hyperplane dependence") so that any interpretation would be Lorentz invariant.

Yet assuming neither can be made Lorentz invariant in the familiar sense, both GRW and Bohm's theory, the "best worked out" versions of collapse and no-collapse interpretations respectively, do appear to require a preferred frame. However, Callender then argues that "tensers" cannot simply identify the preferred frame selected on either interpretation with their metaphysically preferred foliation yielding becoming, i.e., real time. The reason is a "coordination problem" between the two: assume measurements in the two wings of a Bell experiment take place at space-like separation, allowing at least two different foliations of space-time, one in which A measures first, and one where B does so. The Bohmian must choose, but which frame is to be chosen? Only at the sub-quantum level do outcomes pick out a preferred frame; but the Bohmian, in principle lacking knowledge of the particle's initial position in the wave packet, can never tell which inertial frame that is. After all, at the statistical level, special relativity obtains. Then what possible reason could the "tenser" appeal to that would permit identification of that inertial frame with the metaphysically real temporal becoming frame? Giving his message proper emphasis, Callender affirms "it would be a miracle if the two frames coincided exactly" (p. 63). So it is overwhelmingly likely that, e.g., if one frame regards A to occur before B, then the other would view B to occur first. An analogous argument is given for GRW.

Thus even the two "best" scenarios of quantum interpretations mandating a preferred frame do not give the "tenser" what he needs: reliable physical evidence for selecting the preferred frame implementing the metaphysical notion of becoming. Of course, one can simply dismiss the need for one's metaphysics to conform to physics. Callender's essay is a model of exposition and philosophical argument that should have been taken on board by some of the other philosophers in the volume. Unfortunately, they are "tensers" who blithely assert what Callender considers a miracle, that the absolute frame "where physical systems have their real, absolute, temporal and spatial coordinates … is the absolute frame disclosed in the Aspect experiments" (p. 82).

Maudlin's contribution ("Non-local correlations in quantum theory: how the trick might be done"), serves to call attention to Roderick Tumulka's relativistic construal of the GRW spontaneous collapse theory.[3] Regarded by Maudlin as "a development of the first magnitude", Tomulka, a mathematician at Rutgers, has constructed a theory with a Lorentz metric displaying quantum non-locality. The theory exploits an observation made by Bell twenty-five years ago, that the GRW model (a stochastic and non-linear modification of the Schrödinger equation) has a property (multi-time translation invariance) that might allow circumvention of the fundamental relativistic difficulty that there is no temporal ordering of space-like separated events. In Tomulka's theory, the local beables are elementary "flash" events at particular points of space-time associated with collapses of the GRW wave function, viz., those lying at the center of the Gaussian by which the wave function is multiplied.

So far, this is similar to the "flashy" version of GRW first outlined by Bell. But whereas both GRW and "flashy GRW" use absolute time in specifying the probability measure for the collapses (which occur at a fixed rate per unit time), Tumulka has only point-like events privileging no reference frame. The intervals between these events according to the posited Lorentz metric determine a set of space-like 3-surfaces; each of these has a purely spatial metric. A rule (depending upon Tomulka's initial N- Dirac particle wave function) then allows calculation of the conditional probability of the next flash at a particular location, given the previous flashes that define the relevant 3-surface. A major drawback: Tomulka's theory employs a multi-time wave function defined on the Cartesian product of N copies of space-time, ruling out particle interactions and, so, much of physics. Interested readers can find the paper on Tomulka's website[4] and work through the details themselves.

To this reviewer, the remaining contributions are of considerably less significance. William Lane Craig ("The metaphysics of special relativity: three views") gives a theistic derivation of Lorentzian metaphysics, a 3+1 ontology of spatial objects enduring through a privileged time. Cognizant of the limited dialectical effectiveness of this kind of argument, he then presents a critical comparison of the rival views, issuing in the same conclusion. Quentin Smith's lengthy paper has a rather tedious title stating its aim ("A radical rethinking of quantum gravity: rejecting Einstein's relativity and unifying Bohmian quantum mechanics with a Bell-neo-Lorentzian absolute time, space and gravity"). Smith proposes to achieve this by bringing together "ideas and equations scattered throughout the physics literature which have not been conjoined and organized and presented as a theory" (p. 75). Despite a striking claim to the contrary ("I believe the essential ideas are here. There is here a Q[uantum] G[ravity] theory that has overcome any major obstacles", p. 98), Smith has not been at all successful, in part due to an appalling number of typos, misprints, mangled equations, and run-on sentences. The paper appears not to have been proofread.

Tooley ("A defense of absolute simultaneity") offers two arguments in favor of absolute simultaneity, a metaphysical one and one appealing to quantum mechanics. The latter benightedly runs afoul of Callender's "coordination problem" while the metaphysical argument rests on a dubious inference to the best explanation-type maneuver for the continued existence of space-time. Swinburne's "Cosmic simultaneity" is a revamped version of a chapter from his 1981 book Space and Time. Wielding the principle of simplicity as probable evidence for truth, he argues that the laws of cosmology (essentially, the Hubble recession law) acquire their simplest form with a cosmos-wide relation of absolute simultaneity.

Lucas ("The special theory and absolute simultaneity") is concerned to rebut the perceived threat to modern theism seemingly posed by special relativity, namely, "If time is unreal, the way we live now in the time of our mortal life is of no significance sub specie aeternitatis." No worries. Special relativity, properly understood, is only "a theory of electromagnetic radiation" and of course "electromagnetism is not the whole of physics". Whereas "modern physics" (summarized in one paragraph on p. 287) "far from undermining our intuitive sense of the reality of time vindicates it." Alas, one wishes here for a fuller discussion. Finally, the essay by Crisp ("Presentism, eternalism and relativity physics") modestly aims to establish that "current physics … gives us no good reason" to prefer orthodox understandings of relativity theory over presentist versions, such as that of Julian Barbour. However, he understands orthodoxy about space-time theories as a commitment to space-time substantivalism, and so implying "eternalism". That certainly is a contentious assumption.

[1] For a more considered assessment see Arthur I. Miller, Albert Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity: Emergence (1905) and Early Interpretation (1905-1911), Springer, 1997; and Michel Paty, Einstein philosophe, PUF, 1993.

[2] Nicholas Harrigan and Robert W. Spekkens, "Einstein, incompleteness, and the epistemic view of quantum states", arXiv:0706.2661v1 [quant-ph] 18 Jun 2007.

[3] Roderick Tomulka, "A Relativistic Version of the Ghirardi-Rimini-Weber Model", Journal of Statistical Physics 125 (2006), 821-840.

[4] http://www.math.rutgers.edu/~tumulka/papers/