Einstein's Unification

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Jeroen van Dongen, Einstein's Unification, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 213 pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521883467.

Reviewed by Peter Pesic, St. John's College, Santa Fe


Einstein's long-sustained efforts to create a unified field theory characterized his whole oeuvre and exemplified his deepest concerns. Though taken by many physicists as evidence of the fundamental failure of his program, contemporary seekers for a Grand Unified Theory point to his visionary quest as prophetic of their cause. In Einstein's Unification, Jeroen van Dongen offers a concise, insightful, and trenchant account of Einstein's attempts to find a unified field theory, connecting his work on general relativity with his later unsuccessful attempts to incorporate electromagnetism in that theory as well as to explain the probabilistic aspects of quantum mechanics. Though in certain passages van Dongen includes some equations to clarify his exposition, the book as a whole is not technical and is readily accessible to readers who are more interested in the general philosophical contours of the arguments than in their mathematical details. On the other side, for readers who come from physics, this book is blessedly free of contemporary philosophical jargon and does not restrict itself to the special preoccupations of the philosophy of science as a present-day subspecialty. Sharing the concerns of several worlds, van Dongen's book helpfully bridges the concerns of philosophers, historians, and physicists.

Van Dongen is an assistant professor at the Institute for History and Foundations of Science at Utrecht University and has served as an editor in the Einstein Collected Papers project. Thus, he has been closely involved with the ongoing publication of the relevant original documents, which (as of this writing) has only reached 1921, so that van Dongen includes many interesting passages from documents that have not yet appeared. The present book began as a doctoral dissertation but also includes valuable material from van Dongen's subsequent research. His commentary also helps the reader make contact with the recent literature and includes a good bibliography.

Van Dongen begins with a detailed account of Einstein's path to general relativity, not only to give the historical background for his later work but also to argue that this struggle taught Einstein lessons he relied on ever after. As van Dongen emphasizes, Einstein's initial approach to general relativity had been closely modeled on existing physical theory, which he attempted to generalize in a rather conservative way. The resulting "draft" (Entwurf) theory by Einstein and Grossman (1913) represents an important way-station, whose limitations and contradictions later convinced Einstein that he needed to adopt a more thorough-going mathematical approach, rather than hewing so closely to the phenomena and to the earlier Newtonian theory, which he understandably expected his own theory to yield as a limiting case.

Einstein took his 1915 success in formulating "beautiful" tensor equations as a touchstone for his later efforts to unify field theory still further. He became convinced that, rather than paying attention above all to the phenomena and their physics, he should be guided in his search by the underlying structure of mathematics. This was a fateful choice, which van Dongen illustrates by the successive revisions in the methodological schema Einstein developed and summarized by a sketch he included in a 1952 letter to his old friend Maurice Solovine (a fellow-member of the light-hearted but still serious "Olympia Academy" they had founded together in their youth). This sketch gives pictorial form to Einstein's working methods, as befits someone who insisted that his thought processes were primarily visual.

Here van Dongen adds a valuable chapter on Einstein's changing relation to experiment, including the fascinating story of Einstein's involvement with the experimental work of Wander de Haas and later with Emil Rupp (a little-known episode which van Dongen has studied in his own recent papers). Einstein and Rupp hoped to use a canal ray light source (produced by excited atoms moving with homogenous velocity in a beam and emitting light) to show that the emission of light quanta was instantaneous, as Einstein expected because of the particle-like behavior he had first noted in the photoelectric effect. Rupp later turned out to have fabricated some of his results; the ensuring controversy may well have discouraged Einstein from becoming more involved in the intricacies and pitfalls of experiment. At the very least, Einstein "felt increasingly incompetent to judge the internal criteria adopted by experimentalists," as van Dongen puts it (81). Such considerations would help explain why Einstein increasingly turned to "top-down" theorizing, guided by mathematical elegance, as opposed to the messy "bottom-up" generalization from phenomena.

Van Dongen then turns to the story of Einstein's successive attempts to craft unified field theories that would incorporate electromagnetism at a fundamental geometric level, rather than simply as an empirical part of the stress-energy tensor that curves space-time. Nor was this all: he also hoped that such a field theory would explain on fundamental deterministic grounds the probabilistic behavior that quantum theory treated as irreducible. Further, he suspected that particles would emerge as singular solutions of the unified field equations, rather than having to be inserted by hand as elements of experience, seemingly unrelated to space-time geometry through which they traveled as strangers.

In the pursuit of this audacious vision, Einstein turned successively to a series of mathematical structures, each of which he hoped would unlock the door to unification. In 1932, he and Walther Mayer tried to generalize Dirac's spinors, which are crucial elements of the quantum theory of spin; whereas a vector remains invariant if one rotates the spatial coordinates around the z axis (for example) by 360 degrees, under that rotation a spinor changes its sign, hence resumes its initial sign after two entire rotations (720 degrees). As such, spinors act roughly as the "square roots" of vectors, needed by Dirac in his theory because he was using the square root that relates relativistic energy and momentum.

Here van Dongen usefully points out how closely Einstein had studied Dirac's work, though in general Einstein does not seem to have interested himself in developments of quantum mechanical formalism after 1928. (For instance, he was not struck by Richard Feynman's path integral formulation even after John Wheeler presented it to him personally, a story that van Dongen does not include.) Yet Einstein always kept nearby a copy of Dirac's classic book on quantum theory. When Einstein and Mayer took up the theory of spinors, they were therefore trying to profit from mathematical structures that emerged in quantum mechanical formalism. This act of creative reappropriation shows that it is inadequate to consider Einstein simply an enemy to quantum theory. The Einstein-Mayer theory of semivectors tried to generalize spinors, but eventually proved equivalent to them. Their hopes to build a new, classical theory using semivectors accordingly did not work out, as Wolfgang Pauli pointed out with his usual acerbity.

After this démarche, Einstein then tried another approach using five (rather than four) dimensions for space-time, following the earlier theories of Theodor Kaluza and Oskar Klein, who already in the 1920s pursued the extra dimension as a strategy to incorporate the electromagnetic potential into general relativity. Van Dongen gives a full and interesting account of how Einstein pursued this idea along with his collaborators Valentin Bargmann and Peter Bergmann. As this work unfolded, it seems that Einstein's real goal was not so much to incorporate electromagnetism as to supplant quantum mechanics by deriving it from a classical field theory.

In this, he was deaf to the repeated objections of his friends Pauli and Hermann Weyl, not to speak of the silent disinterest of the rest of physicists in his program. Van Dongen reminds us of the paradox, even the supreme irony, that the great physicist who had early distanced himself from purely mathematical theory eventually became a partisan of "top-down" theorizing at all costs. This was not so much mere stubbornness as Einstein remaining faithful to the critical episode in his life, the revelation of the saving power of mathematics in his struggle with general relativity. Here too we realize his implicit sympathy with Dirac, who also had been converted to the religion of mathematical beauty after his own formative experience with the search for his relativistic wave equation for the electron.

Van Dongen concludes with a fine account of Einstein's relation to quantum theory, emphasizing an insufficiently well-known statement by Einstein (playing on Cato's motto Carthago delenda est) that quantum theory (unlike Carthage) was not to be destroyed but deduced. What is totally incomprehensible to me is how Einstein could have been so incurious as not to be struck by the phenomenon of antiparticles, for instance, which emerge so starkly from Dirac's equation. How could Einstein have taken his disdain for "mere phenomenology" -- the messy details of atomic and nuclear physics -- to the point of neglecting and overlooking huge theoretical breakthroughs, like the emergence of antiparticles as an overarching theme of quantum field theory? I wonder whether van Dongen might have been able to indicate future ways in which we could learn more about this enigma.

For I still remain puzzled, even bewildered, about Einstein's seeming blindness to such huge shifts in the phenomenal as well as theoretical worlds. Perhaps van Dongen's point is that it is all-too-human for even such a one as Einstein finally to lapse into a certain rigidity of position, even of willful ignorance, on the basis of highly charged personal experiences and the attendant philosophical bulwarks he erected. The great merit of van Dongen's book is to locate these experiences within the frame of Einstein's own theoretical struggles, which surely were the consuming intellectual arena of his inner life. We here appreciate the enormous importance of what sometimes are called "internalistic" factors, those that bespeak the long-range effect of physical and mathematical ideas that have such compelling inner resonance especially for Einstein, who experienced the force of these ideas with almost visceral intensity. Such "internalistic" accounts have been unjustly neglected in recent history of science, which instead has been eager to elevate "externalistic" factors that reflect larger social, cultural, and material trends, more easily understood by those who have no feeling for the internal play of theme and counter-theme that signified so much not only for Einstein but also his generation of physicists.

Van Dongen's book is an excellent resource for all who wish to understand Einstein more deeply, balancing the technical, the philosophical, and the historical with skill and judgment. To be sure, Vladimir Vizgin's book on Einstein's unified field theories remains of permanent value for its detailed technical treatment of the exact unfolding of the arguments, as does Abraham Pais's terse and telling account in his classic intellectual biography of Einstein, Subtle is the Lord. By adding to his careful technical comments a nuanced, undogmatic treatment of the philosophical issues, van Dongen has made a truly valuable contribution to our understanding of Einstein.