Elective Affinities: Musical Essays on the History of Aesthetic Theory

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Lydia Goehr, Elective Affinities: Musical Essays on the History of Aesthetic Theory, Columbia University Press, 2008, 386pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231144803.

Reviewed by Andrew Bowie, Royal Holloway, University of London


The 'philosophy of music', especially in its analytical guise, has rarely faced up to the problem, already suggested by Schleiermacher, that establishing philosophical claims about works of art presumably entails already having an agreed system of philosophy upon which to base those claims. This would, though, 'mean deferring the matter to infinity', because such a system requires universal consensus.[1] The agenda of the analytical philosophy of music has, of course, been notably restricted, to the point where it is arguable that it is not really about music at all, but is rather an exercise in ontology which seeks to define the essence of the object 'musical work'. Is the work, for instance, the score or the 'compliance class' of all performances of the score? Does the musical object express anything, mean anything? And so on. Significantly, musicians don't, in my experience, ever worry about this. Moreover, as Lydia Goehr pointed out in her first book, The Imaginary Museum of Musical Works, the notion of musical work that dominated the analytical philosophy of music until recently did not really exist until the eighteenth century anyway, so ontological claims are rather out of place, given the necessity for an adequate consideration of history in understanding music in philosophical terms.

By seeing music as best dealt with predominantly in terms of 'conceptual analysis' (which, since Quine, looks increasingly like no more than figuring out how one can best use words, rather than a method exclusive to philosophy), analytical philosophy of music seemed to feel justified in ignoring large parts of the history of philosophy (including recent and contemporary work in European philosophy) in which music was a significant issue. It presumably did so on the grounds that it could learn nothing from such approaches, because they were not up to speed on how to do philosophy properly. (The absence of, for example, Adorno is almost never discussed, so one has to guess why he is absent.) What was pretty well universally the case in the analytical philosophy of music was the sense that there was nothing which philosophy could learn from music, because the job of philosophy is to give a correct conceptual characterisation of whatever its object of analysis is supposed to be. That one of the progenitors of the analytical approach to philosophy, Ludwig Wittgenstein, made the following remarks, seems incomprehensible, then, if considered in the terms of the analytical philosophy of music: 'It is impossible for me to say in my book one word about all that music has meant in my life. How then can I hope to be understood?',[2] and 'People today think that scientists are there to instruct them, poets, musicians etc. to give them pleasure. That the latter have something to teach them never occurs to them'.[3] The future of the philosophy of music will, one hopes, be informed by this stance, rather than by the incipient arrogance of some analytical approaches.

The subtitle of Lydia Goehr's new book makes it clear that she does not adhere to the division of labour assumed in the analytical tradition: the essays are not just about music, they are in some sense 'musical'. This means, for example, that her concern with 'elective affinity' is not intended as a general argument about philosophy and music, but rather has to do with the kind of links between ideas, music, politics, etc., which are in some respects analogous to the links between thematic and other material in a piece of music. Goehr's book can be seen, then, as belonging to the 'philosophy of music' in both the subjective and the objective genitive (see Bowie 2007).[4] Instead of music just learning from philosophy, philosophy can also learn from music: 'There is no such thing as the philosophy of music if by this we mean that philosophy is the clean and established method by which to capture the musical object. Philosophy and music stand instead in a mutually informing relationship' (p. 41). In chapters on such varied topics as, among others, the movement of music and the movement of philosophy, music and the end of art, 'the experimental', film and music, and opera in America, Goehr explores the entanglement of music and philosophy which is a feature of the modern period.

The theoretical spiritus rector for the book is Adorno, and this is a source of both the book's strengths and its weaknesses. The problem with Adorno with regard to the philosophy of music can be characterised in terms of the contrast between his ability to write philosophy which is musical in its suggestiveness and complexity, and his sometimes misplaced advocacy of what one can term 'philosophical music'. This is music which, for example, supposedly exemplifies the 'state of the material' (i.e. the most advanced techniques of a period) that composers have to live up to if their music is not to be part of the 'culture industry'. Such subordination of music to philosophy leads Adorno, for example, to the absurdities of his attacks on jazz (attacks which recently published material in the notes to his Towards a Theory of Musical Reproduction suggests he began to question in later life), and his schematic rejection of Stravinsky in favour of Schoenberg in Philosophy of New Music (which he also questioned later in his career). One source of this subordination is Adorno's apocalyptic version of his judgement on the state of reason in a modernity epitomised by the Holocaust, that is summed up in the dictum that 'The whole is the untrue'. It is when Goehr's book adopts too much of Adorno's (admittedly in some respects historically understandable) apocalyptic vision that it seems at its weakest.

Goehr's book offers: 'a history of attraction and reaction (hence, the elective affinities) of music to philosophy, drama, birdsong, crime, film, and nationhood. As philosophical histories of thought and idea, they explore concepts such as movement, affinity, musicality, naturalism, experimentalism, displacement, actuality, and possibility' (p. ix). The apparent series of category clashes makes it clear that one cannot approach the book just at the level of argumentative assertion. This is as it should be: given the issues raised by the relationship between music and philosophy, one should not expect another philosophical run through the tired agenda of the philosophy of music. However, if we see the world as it appears in the following remark, it becomes hard to grasp the diversity of significances of music in modernity it suggests, because they will all, according to Goehr, be subject to the deceptions of the false whole: 'Adorno consequently preoccupies himself lifelong with the question of what contemporary form art and nature can appear in, given that the whole now is false' (p. 38). Art (leaving apart nature, which Adorno has some deeply interesting ways of rethinking, beyond the Kantian view of it as the system of necessary laws) can, however, appear in so many forms that the philosophical issue as suggested here is questionable.

Take an example of how art for Adorno and Goehr 'can appear':

Later in life, Adorno also mentioned Maurizio Kagel's score for the 1965 film Antithèse: Film for One Performer with Electronic and Everyday Sounds, a film in which Adorno found what he most often found in works he considered genuinely new: a space for repressed individuals to speak through silence in opposition to the articulated and compromised word. (p. 248)

Although what is meant here can play a valid role in some kinds of modernism in certain contexts, this view relies too much on a philosophical topos which only allows a certain kind of art to speak. It can, though, hardly be said that this specific work played any significant role in social or aesthetic developments, however admirable some of Kagel's work could be in challenging stuffy attitudes in music. Messages in bottles are all very well, but most of them do get lost.

Goehr is aware of the general problem I am suggesting, as the beginning of the following passage indicates:

if the world were really fully or finally administered, there would be no point going on with philosophy or thinking. Although Adorno writes as though making a final claim -- as, say, 'the whole is untrue' -- he intends through the dialectical movement of his argument to produce a rupture in the claim. He must produce a rupture in the claim because, in a genuinely immanent critique, the ongoing movement of the argument is the only way left to break through the world's contemporary deceit. One deceit is to claim that the world accommodates all differences while in fact it reduces everything to the always and everywhere the same. (p. 22)

The final sentence returns us, of course, to the original problem. If commodification is so total, claiming that this is the case results in the problem of how to articulate at all what is different. Goehr's universalising claim is presumably itself subject to the same reduction that she wishes to criticise with the claim. Indeed, the claim is rather too close to the kind of mimicking of Adorno present in his uncritical admirers, which she elsewhere avoids by the subtlety of her detailed explorations, and which is itself an example of the kind of commodification of thinking that Adorno's own best work seeks to avoid.

The Adornian stance present in the following: 'Only works, Adorno concludes, that appear as "politically dead," because they commit themselves to genuinely autonomous form, have a chance of being "uncompromisingly radical"' (p. 201) seems historically inappropriate to many kinds of art. Jazz history, for instance, suggests why. Some of the greatest modern jazz was radical both aesthetically and politically: its role in the Civil Rights movement, both at the time of the movement and in what led to the movement, should not be underestimated. Adorno was clearly wrong in this respect about the music he thought of as 'uncompromisingly radical', i.e. Second Viennese School, and this ought to make us suspicious of the methodology behind such claims. Goehr cites another example from his disastrous recently published work on the radio, which repeats the basic problem: 'The symphony that once promoted the illusion of pent-up time was now experienced as identical to the forty-minute slot granted in the day, between meals, advertising, and newsbreaks' (p. 242). This might well be the case for some people (need that be such a problem?), but symphonies on the radio were a source of revelation to me as a student, despite the technological limitations. I then went on to spend large parts of the time I studied in Berlin in the concert hall. The point is that when one looks at the empirical detail of such phenomena there is nearly always an aspect which resists the totalising philosophical claim.

The danger here is admittedly that, by citing the fairly obvious exceptions to Adorno's and Goehr's overly totalising claims, one may appear complacent about what lies behind the claims, namely the desire to be vigilant about culture, in the name of preventing a repetition of the nightmares of the past. The task for work on the relationship between philosophy and music is to find new ways of dealing with these issues -- which have been almost constitutively absent from the English-language philosophy of music -- that take more account of the specifics of our own historical situation. This situation may indeed share more than one would like with the situation as Adorno saw it, but this has to be established through detailed analysis of real cultural phenomena, rather than assumed on the basis of a questionable philosophical diagnosis of the state of the modern world. Goehr's book offers lots of material for the former, for instance in excellent passages on experimental art, or on Beethoven's Ninth, but it at times relies too much on the philosophical diagnosis for analysing that material.

[1] F.D.E Schleiermacher, Vorlesungen über die Ästhetik, (Berlin, Reimer, 1842), p. 48.

[2] In ed. Rush Rhees, Ludwig Wittgenstein Porträts und Gespräche, (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1984), p. 160.

[3] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Culture and Value, (Oxford: Blackwell, 1980), p. 36.

[4] Andrew Bowie, Music, Philosophy and Modernity, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).