Elemental Discourses

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John Sallis, Elemental Discourses, Indiana University Press, 2018, 175pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253037244.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Powell, Marshall University


The publication of this book is an event for those familiar with the work of John Sallis, for it is the first volume to be published by Indiana University Press in the forty-three volume series The Collected Writings of John Sallis. It is volume four of Part II of The Collected Writings and contains eight chapters of previously unpublished lectures and talks, as well as two previously published essays. The latter two are chapter 6, "Alterity and the Elemental," which was originally published as "Levinas and the Elemental" in 1998 in Research in Phenomenology; and chapter 8, "The Scope of Visibility," originally published as "The Extent of Visibility" in the collection Phenomenology and the Metaphysics of Sight. The Collected Writings will consist of three parts: Part I will be Sallis's originally published monographs; Part II will be previously published papers, lectures, and talks that will be gathered together according to five different themes; and Part III will be lecture courses delivered over the course of Sallis's career that are either figure or topic specific.

This particular volume, while consisting largely of previously unpublished material, is anything but a random selection from the vaults of Sallis's many unpublished talks. Rather, these materials have been carefully selected and organized from beginning to end, and to some degree all the essays are concerned with the very nature of philosophical discourse, or even the very possibility and origin of discourse, philosophical and otherwise. This is not to say all the essays are all specifically concerned with the question of language, but they are acutely attuned to the origin and limits of language. I will briefly address all ten chapters in the book, and although the question of language will not be at the center of my treatment, it will never be far away.

Chapter 1, "Voices," treats the nature of voice, φωνή, voix, from Plato through Derrida before finally returning to Plato at the very end of the chapter. The chapter is oriented through, and motivated by, Derrida's reading of Husserl in Voice and Phenomenon and the metaphysical privileging of the voice in the self-presence of what Derrida calls phonocentrism. What Sallis accomplishes in this chapter is a return to the trace of the voice in all writing, thus seizing an aspect of Derrida that has gone largely ignored: the disruption of self-presence in expression (and thus phenomenological indication), which makes known the many voices of the outside that haunt all interiority. Sallis accomplishes this by first turning his attention to the "legacy running from Aristotle to Hegel" and "what Derrida will call phonocentrism" (4). He then provides in outline Derrida's early reading of Husserl that challenges the security of self-presence through an appeal to the outside that is thought by Derrida as writing and différance. This concern with Derrida's early reading of Husserl will return in the penultimate chapter.

Chapter 2, "Gathering Language," is a meditation on Heidegger's later thinking about language. The focus here is largely on two of Heidegger's treatments of language, the dialogue with the Japanese referred to as a "conversation" (Gespräch) rather than a dialogue (Dialog), and the simply titled essay, "Language." The first half of the chapter addresses the conversation with the Japanese, a conversation that culminates in establishing the relation between the human being and Being that is achieved through language. Towards the close of that discussion, Sallis writes: "It is on the way to language -- that is, from language -- that humans are granted their relation to Being" (29). The chapter then turns to the essay "Language" as directed by the earlier conversation. Following a brief analysis of "Language," we discover a subversive move on the part of Sallis, a move that is subtle and more prominent in his later work, a move that is subversive specifically with regard to Heidegger. In this chapter, this move is an unsettling of the very title of the chapter, as Sallis's attention becomes increasingly diverted away from gathering and directed more towards a wandering away. After likening language to the imagination, Sallis remarks: "The question is whether it suffices to restrict the operation of imagination to gathering or whether something like a wandering, even a wandering away beyond, does not belong essentially to it" (35).

In the next chapter, "The Play of Translation," this wandering is extended to a wandering between two languages, a wandering of translation already announced in Chapter 2. Indeed, translation would seem to require a kind of wandering, a wandering from one language to another, a wandering that can easily lose its way between languages. Anyone who has ever attempted translation will accept this as virtually a priori. But, translation is not limited to the movement of thought or meaning between two or more languages; rather, translation occurs within a single language as when one elaborates or employs a synonym or defines a term. "In this sense, it could, then, be said that thinking is translation" (39). Thinking is the translation that occurs in the constitution of meaning, and the measure of thinking would be the degree to which thinking has captured the meaning appropriate to it. This meaning is sheltered in a language, and the original language of philosophy is Greek. Turning, then, to Hegel, Sallis gives attention to the engine of Hegel's thinking, the untranslatable Aufheben. As that engine, "Hegel's thinking cannot but . . . speak German" (50). And yet, according to Heraclitus, prior to any speaking, be it Greek or German, there is first required a listening, not to a language, but to the λόγος, and only then "To say in words what has been heard, to give voice to it, to let its silence sound forth, cannot but be, in the most originary sense, translation" (51).

With Chapter 4, "Things of Sense," the composition of this first volume of Sallis's Collected Writings begins to be revealed in a more penetrating manner. While the previous chapter concluded with an appeal to an originary "sense" of translation, a translation from silence to signification, Chapter 4 concludes by noting in Merleau-Ponty an identity of these two notions of sense that are given in perception. That is, The Phenomenology of Perception addresses, among other things, the sensible thing as the milieu of its sensible aspects and "the sense or significance (sens) of the thing" (63). The thing is not a thing separable from a subject that perceives it, but rather the two are within bodily perception always already a synthesis that, as such, is interwoven. That is, the body is the site of this identity and, as such, what is called for is a reconfiguring of the relation of body to soul such that body is no longer something distinct from signification and soul is no longer distinct from sensible things.

Chapter 5, "Archaic Nature," begins and ends with the Greek dictum that "Nature loves to hide" (66) and traces a number of ways in which this occurs in the philosophical canon. The chapter begins by appealing to the Greek μορφή as the origin of nature, which is to say as its ἀρχή. This nature then becomes a nature hiding implicitly in the difference between subject and object in the difference between Fichte and Schelling. That latter difference turns out to be a difference in which there is initially no difference inasmuch as both require the imagination for the transition from one sphere to the other. However, the imagination is a power of the subject -- or, at least it is until Schelling's On the Essence of Human Freedom, where there is discovered the imagination "freeing itself from subjectivity" (74). That freeing of imagination is at the same time a freeing of nature -- not natural things -- from the absolute being that is the identity of subject and object. Nature is then thought in accord with Plato's χώρα, and that gives rise to what Sallis calls the elemental. Much like χώρα, although not identical to it, "nature as elemental would provide and articulate the very space within which natural things would come to be present" (81). This chapter is a formal introduction to the remaining chapters which address more directly the elemental in the title of this collection, a notion that has been at the center of Sallis's writings since at least the major works on the imagination, The Force of Imagination and The Logic of Imagination.

Chapter 6, "Alterity and the Elemental," focuses on the il y a or there is of Levinas, what holds being and beings together in their opposition. The there is is characterized by Levinas as the impersonal, the darkness, the elemental night. Just as in the previous chapter, Sallis takes note of the elemental, this time in Levinas, as distinguished from the beings that emerge only by virtue of it. And yet, while beings come to presence only by virtue of the elemental, the elemental conceals itself, withdraws into itself, withdraws from presencing all the while allowing for the presencing of things. The il y a is aligned with the nothing in a twofold sense: as what remains in the absence of all beings, and as what returns (beings) to nothingness. Both of these senses are sustained by the imagination. Through the imagination one can conjure the il y a, and somehow, along with that conjuring, the elemental. As opposed to the things of the world that return to the il y a and emerge from out of the ether of the concealed elemental by means of enjoyment and incorporation, the elemental is other, radically other, than what can be incorporated. For Sallis, one's comportment to the elemental calls for a different attunement than an alimentary one, one that would be "responsive rather than reactive to the very strangeness of the earth" (98).

Chapter 7, "Objectivity and the Reach of Enchorial Space," is composed of two parts, the first of which culminates in a re-directing of Heidegger's deconstruction of the dual sense of the object as there for us and the object as it is in itself. Following his analysis of Being and Time and Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, Sallis recounts Heidegger's turn away from a spatiality grounded in world and a world grounded in temporality and towards time-space as "the happening of clearing (Lichtung)" (108). Sallis then returns to Fichte and the early Schelling in whom he endorses "a shift from the conception of imagination as a power of synthesis to that of imagination as a hovering (Schweben) between different terms in such way as to hold them together in their difference" (ibid.). This re-directing, it should be noted, is not a critique of Heidegger, but rather an opening of the Heideggerian discourse to other possible paths. The path followed by Sallis is referred to as spacing. This gives way in part 2 of the chapter to the "unapparent" space before space. That is, it gives way to the claim that "the χώρα would be a protospace, a space before space" (118). However, the real issue for Sallis is: How to connect χώρα with the expanse of the apparent/unapparent of earth and sky in such manner that that expanse is no longer subject to the Heideggerian reduction of χώρα to Cartesian extension? That is, how is one to think "enchorial space," a space of the elemental and the things that can become manifest in the elementals? This would require for Sallis a phenomenology: "Such a phenomenology would require a vision receptive not only to what can be rendered manifest but equally to what in its very appearance withdraws leaving only a trace of its retreat from our vision" (121).

The next chapter, "The Scope of Visibility," takes up this question of visibility through three dialogues of Plato, the Republic, Theaetetus, and Phaedo. Sallis here shows that all three dialogues appeal to what is not visible in the common sense of visibility in order to account for visibility. From the cave allegory in the Republic, Sallis notes that the ascent upward, out of the cave, in order to see the things as they truly are, is a learning of the one. Noting that the one is well . . . one, it cannot be divided, and that all numbers are simply ones. This realization requires a different kind of visibility, for the common sense of visibility never sees the one, only things that are divisible. As such, with regard to the visibility of the one, "Their visibility is a dianoetic visibility compounded with invisibility to sense, their apprehension a seeing compounded with not seeing" (128). From the Theaetetus, Sallis focuses on the claim "that knowledge (ἐπιστήμη) is perception (αἴθησις)" (128). Such a claim, Sallis emphasizes, makes λόγος impossible.

The focus then shifts to the tug-of-war comparison between the Heracliteans and the Eleatics, the two pulls between "those who set everything flowing, now toward those who arrest all things" (129). This tug-of-war is to demonstrate that the mere perception of things does not yield knowledge; and that perception must be exceeded or supplemented for the yielding of knowledge. This supplement accounts for the fact that any specific perception must be conjoined with other specific perceptions and gathered together "into one look" (130) for knowledge. This one look appeals, then, to yet another vision that exceeds the common notion of vision. From the Phaedo, Sallis sets his sights on Socrates' second sailing, how Socrates became who he became, and to an inquiry into the origin or ἀρχή of things. All things come to be illuminated and generated, and to view them in their origin would be to view them in the light; however, to look directly into the light is to be blinded. Thus, once again, another kind of visibility is called for, a visibility of the ἀρχή that makes all things visible. Rather than looking directly to the ἀρχή, "Socrates turns instead to λόος" (134). In turning to the λόγοι, Socrates turns towards the look of things, which is to say he turns "to the look of the cause (τῆς αἰτίας τὸ εἶδος" (136). This, in turn, gives rise to a new question: How to reconcile the two looks, the two senses of visibility? In a sense, the old metaphysical questions remain, but the terms of the questions have been reconfigured, deconstructed, such that a different response is called for. Sallis's call for such a response condenses the chapter and anticipates the response that will follow in the final two chapters:

With the acknowledgement that there are beings that lie absolutely beyond the limits of visibility, that there are beings to which no extension of visibility can reach, that there are beings utterly beyond the utmost scope of visibility, another beginning would seem to be imperative, one in which being would at such extremes be detached from visibility and from presence to vision. It is perhaps only in this respect that we can at present discern the shape that this beginning must take. (137)

Sallis's response to this other beginning revolves around Plato and Heidegger, especially from the Timaeus and Contributions to Philosophy. Chapter 9, "Cosmic Time," and chapter 10, "The Negativity of Time-Space," are responses to the enigma of the two kinds of vision to come from another beginning . . . another time, a time before time.

What both of these chapters also have in common is an appeal to the mathematically determined physics. What is discovered in both Plato and the observations attributed to the Hubble Space Telescope is a discontinuity between intuition and presence due to a discontinuity in time, and thus a disruption of the metaphysical bond between intuition and presence that was the target of Heideggerian deconstruction. More specifically, while Plato appeals to a cosmic time that is revealed as the identity of cosmos and time, his second discourse from the Timaeus concerning the χώρα asserts another time that would give rise to the cosmos and its identity with time. Sallis writes that "Since time is nothing other than the cosmos, Timaeus' retreat is to another time that would be anterior to cosmic time. This time, the time of the χώρα would be precosmic time, a time before time" (144). What is more, Sallis draws attention to the time that is present for observation through Hubble, that the time that is present is not the present time but rather a time of the distant past. The time of the past, then, encroaches on the time of the present, invades it and disrupts its purity as present. The implication is that the time before time introduces a discontinuity into cosmic time, in both cases a before has invaded the time of the present. And further, this is all consistent with Derrida's reading of Husserl in Voice and Phenomenon, in which he shows that the constitution of the present is invaded by retention, leading Sallis to write that "the past enters into the very constitution, the very upsurge, of the present" (152). Sallis then builds on this analysis in the final chapter through series of very dense analyses of Heidegger's thinking of time and time-space, analyses that then lead him to question Heidegger's critical stance towards calculative thinking, for it is that thinking that "opens the space of what is abyssally incalculable" (172).

This is a remarkable collection of essays that serve as a rewarding introduction to the more mature thought of Sallis and it should be a feast of discourse for anyone interested in the texts and issues upon which Sallis plows his fields.