Elucidating the Tractatus: Wittgenstein's Early Philosophy of Logic and Language

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Marie McGinn, Elucidating the Tractatus: Wittgenstein's Early Philosophy of Logic and Language, Oxford University Press, 2006, 316pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199244448.

Reviewed by Oskari Kuusela, Academy of Finland/University of Helsinki


This book is a contribution to the ongoing debate on Wittgenstein's Tractatus that was initiated by Cora Diamond's articles in the 1980s (reprinted in her Realistic Spirit), and has been a dominant theme in the discussion of Wittgenstein's philosophy since the 1990s. In her work Diamond contested the prevailing interpretation that the Tractatus' purpose is to put forward a metaphysical theory of the essence of language and reality and to determine in this way the bounds of language, including the Tractatus' own language use which, allegedly, is to be recognized as nonsensical on the basis of the very theory articulated in the book. By contrast, Diamond argued, to take seriously Wittgenstein's statement about the nonsensicality of his book is to abandon the view that it contains a theory or gives expression to any truths, the notion of a nonsensical theory or truth being ultimately incomprehensible. Since then this line of interpretation -- often called a "resolute reading" -- has been taken up and developed by many others, including James Conant, occasionally Diamond's co-author. Others, most notably Peter Hacker, have argued against the resolute reading and defended the traditional interpretation. The philosophical significance of this debate on the Tractatus is due to the fact that the interpretation of Wittgenstein's early philosophy affects directly also the interpretation of his later philosophy and, therefore, the evaluation of his work as a whole. In particular, if, as the novel line of interpretation suggests, the reception of Wittgenstein's work in terms of notions and assumptions belonging to logical positivism and Oxford ordinary language philosophy fails to recognize what is distinctive and original in his thought, then a re-evaluation of the relevance of his contribution to philosophy and logic is called for.

Against this backdrop the central aspiration of McGinn's book might be described as follows. On the one hand, she accepts Diamond's critique of the traditional interpretation that the Tractatus cannot be read as putting forward a nonsensical theory. On the other hand, McGinn wants to read the Tractatus as offering "positive insights" into the logic of language, a possibility she takes Diamond's and Conant's reading to exclude. (Accordingly, she prefers not to call her interpretation "resolute" but "anti-metaphysical" and "anti-theoretical" (x, 9).) One might, therefore, speak of two intertwined tasks McGinn sets for herself: 1) The characterization of the status of the Tractatus' remarks about logic as not constituting a theory but nevertheless communicating insights concerning the logic of language. 2) The clarification of those logical insights in a corresponding manner that avoids the attribution of a theory to Wittgenstein. A third task she undertakes, especially in the final chapter of the book, is the description of the relation between Wittgenstein's early philosophy and his later philosophy in the light of her interpretation of the Tractatus.

With respect to the first task, McGinn characterizes the status of the Tractatus' statements concerning logic as clarificatory rather than explanatory, whereby clarification is a matter of describing language use and reminding the reader of logical distinctions (and so on) that she already knows on the basis of her linguistic capacity. Such clarifications stand in contrast, for example, with attempts to provide a metaphysical explanation of the logical structure of language by reference to reality and to explain, in this sense, the function of language from a perspective external to language, as is characteristic of realistic interpretations of the Tractatus (9, 20-21, 33). Central to Wittgenstein, according to McGinn, therefore, is the idea that "language itself reveals how it functions" (13), it being both unnecessary and impossible to adopt (in a McDowellian phrase) a "from sideways on" point of view in logical investigation. Here McGinn is inheriting from earlier critics of the realist metaphysical interpretation of the Tractatus, such as Hide Ishiguro, Brian McGuinness, Rush Rhees and Peter Winch, often regarded also as forerunners of resolute readings. But she also provides textual evidence that no one, as far as I am aware, has brought to bear on the issue in just this way. Accordingly, I find her discussion of Wittgenstein's elaborations on certain relevant Tractatarian passages from the pre-Tractatus notebooks quite convincing. Apparently, all this is -- so it seems to me at this point -- sufficient to justify the attribution of a conception of logic as a descriptive discipline to the early Wittgenstein. I shall return below to McGinn's explanation of the status of the Tractatus' statements and the more precise sense of "descriptive" or "clarificatory". The preceding, however, should suffice to provide a rough idea of how she suggests one should understand the Tractatus' approach to the clarification of the logic of language.

As regards the more detailed issues in the philosophy of logic, the discussion of which constitutes the main part of McGinn's book, their examination begins with two chapters that address Wittgenstein's relation to Frege and Russell. These chapters provide a necessary background for understanding what prompts Wittgenstein to adopt the views in logic he does, i.e. what problems he is responding to. Thus, although Wittgenstein adopts Frege's and Russell's conception of logic as constituting the framework for all thought capable of truth/falsity, and the corresponding view that the task of logic is to reveal the essence of thought or the making of true/false judgments, he rejects their universalist conception of logical investigation as the articulation of a system of maximally general truths (31-32, 53). Unlike Frege and Russell, Wittgenstein does not take the essence of judgment-making to be a possible object of true/false judgments, but sees a tension between the characterization of logic as the framework of all judgment-making and the conception of it as an object of judgment. In particular, he maintains that the universalist conception blurs the distinction between accidental (matter of factual) and essential generality, the clarification of which is one of the key issues in the Tractatus and forms the basis of Wittgenstein's differentiation of philosophy and logic from science (166). Rather than in terms of quantifiers (as in "All men are mortal"), essential generality is expressed by variables which Wittgenstein regards as rules for the construction of classes of expressions, not as standing for or representing anything (247-248).

More specifically, McGinn argues that the Tractatus' logical insights concerning the nature of logical connectives, formal concepts, negation, the propositions of logic, the justification of inference, and so on, are all already contained in its clarification of the logic of picturing or the essence of propositions, i.e. Wittgenstein's elucidation of what it is for a proposition to be a true/false representation of reality and to express a sense (162). For a proposition to represent, according to McGinn's interpretation, is for it to have a role in a system of representation that stands in a relation to reality determined by rules of projection. Such rules allow one to derive what is represented from a representation and determine the conditions for the truth/falsity of propositions (81, 87). Importantly, therefore, Wittgenstein regards a proposition as part of a larger system that constitutes a space of logical possibilities in which a proposition determines a place. To be a proposition, that is to say, is not to be an isolated representing of something. The latter kind of a view would make the logical relations into which propositions may enter merely accidental. Instead, Wittgenstein maintains, to be a proposition is to stand -- all along, as it were -- in determinate logical relations to other expressions, for example, to contradict other propositions or be entailed by them, and so on (81, 133). And once all of this has been laid out clearly, the above mentioned issues relating to the philosophy of logic are also resolved. In this sense the question of the essence of propositions, as McGinn explains, is the key question for the early Wittgenstein whose clarification is intended to dissolve a host of logical problems all at once.

As regards the realist interpretation of the Tractatus, McGinn's discussion of the logic of picturing is also intended to show the untenability of readings that regard language as a structure that is supposed to match an independently given reality. Logical structure is something language has as a whole, and something reality possesses only in the capacity of being an object of representation. The opening remarks of the Tractatus then do not articulate a realist metaphysics that lays down requirements for language, but are merely an attempt to clarify the logical order that is essential to any system of true/false representation and shared by all such systems (158).

I find McGinn's discussion of the details of the Tractatus' logic engaging and illuminating. She also manages to give a concrete feel to Wittgenstein's idea of philosophy as the dissolution of problems, as illustrated by her discussion of Wittgenstein's response to Russell's paradox, for example (168-171). This is the general pattern of Tractarian clarifications as described by McGinn: rather than answering problems, Wittgenstein aspires to make them disappear by rendering perspicuous the logic or function of relevant expressions (31). Here philosophical progress then emerges as a matter of coming to see matters more clearly and in sufficient detail, rather than as something achieved by theory construction, the postulation of theoretical entities and principles. When logic is clarified, the problems that seemed to demand answers no longer arise and, therefore, there is no need for theories that were intended to solve those problems. But this is not because one comes to realize the necessity of being quietist about such problems, or their illegitimacy. (This would leave the desire for theory in tact, and not bring the right kind of satisfaction.) Rather, when clarity is achieved what seemed problematic loses its problematic character.

Apparently, this kind of approach is applicable in the case of interpretative questions too. For example, McGinn's discussion of the Tractatus' conception of formal concepts as rules for the construction of expressions seems to do away very effectively with the idea of such concepts as, so to say, quasi-representations of ineffable metaphysical features of reality -- an interpretational temptation many have found hard to resist. What solves the interpretational problem here is the clarification of (Wittgenstein's view of) the logical character and difference between genuine and formal concepts (164-165, 186).

But if this is how clarification works, a question must be raised regarding the relation of McGinn's interpretation to that of Diamond and Conant. As noted, McGinn takes their interpretation to leave no room for positive philosophical insights into the logic of language. Indeed, according to her, Diamond and Conant "want to see Wittgenstein's aims as purely therapeutic, and to deny that Wittgenstein undertakes any positive philosophical task" (6; cf. ix, 9, 19, 75-76). I understand this to mean that McGinn takes Diamond and Conant to read Wittgenstein as engaged in an 'entirely negative philosophical task' of trying to persuade his reader to give up philosophical theorizing by making apparent the nonsensicality of such theories. But it is not clear that such an 'entirely negative' approach would be a comprehensible possibility, nor that Diamond and Conant would attribute such a conception to Wittgenstein. The question is: how is the goal of abandoning philosophical theories supposed to be achieved (in a non-arbitrary way) if not through clarification of the logic of language? The answer appears to be that the Tractatus can only reach the negative philosophical result of establishing the nonsensicality of this or that philosophical theory by offering positive clarifications of logic (of various logical distinctions, and so on). Correspondingly, when Conant writes, for example, that

The Tractatus seeks to bring its reader to the point where he can recognize sentences within the body of the work as nonsensical, not by means of a theory that legislates certain sentences out of the realm of sense, but rather by bringing more clearly into view for the reader the life with language he already leads … (Conant 2002, 423)

it is not easy to see why making perspicuous the life with language someone leads would not count as something positive and as involving insights about logic. Consequently, it seems that either the contrast between McGinn's and Diamond's and Conant's interpretations is not as clear as McGinn suggests, and she might be closer to their interpretation than she thinks, or she means something very specific by "positive philosophical insights" which is left unclear.

More generally, I am left wondering how stable the distinction between clarification and metaphysical theorizing ultimately is, as McGinn describes it. On one interpretation of "metaphysical", evidently operative in her book, metaphysical claims concern the necessary characteristics of reality such as the features in terms of which the realist interpretation of the Tractatus seeks to explain the logical structure of language. On this reading of "metaphysical" the distinction is clear enough: a logical or clarificatory investigation is concerned with language, not with explaining the function of language in terms of something external to language or speculating about the necessary characteristics of reality (100, 158, 251-252). But "metaphysical" might also be understood more broadly, including metaphysical claims about language as the object of philosophical investigation, whereby such claims need not be attempts to explain language by reference to something else but claims about the necessary characteristics of language itself. On such a reading the distinction between "metaphysical" and "clarificatory" seems harder to pin down. The questions is: how does the (intended) role of the reminders McGinn takes Wittgenstein to be offering differ from that of true/false statements (claims, theses)? To this question I failed to find a clear answer in the book.

This is also connected with the task of characterizing the relation between Wittgenstein's early and later philosophy undertaken especially in the book's final chapter. McGinn proposes to describe this relation in terms of a switch from one object of investigation to another. In the Tractatus Wittgenstein saw as his task -- misled by his preconceptions and prejudices about language, such as the assumption that sense must always be determinate -- the clarification of the sublime, idealized essence of language. In his later work, however, he takes the object of investigation to be the concrete phenomenon of everyday language in use (21-22, 26, 76, 286, 289). But what this characterization leaves unclear is whether and in what sense Wittgenstein's philosophical development also involves the development of his conception of the status of philosophical clarificatory statements. Does his conception of the role of such statements remain unaltered or evolve? (Even if one accepts that in both his early and later philosophy Wittgenstein is offering reminders, one may still ask whether his comprehension of the nature of such reminders changes.) The question might also be put as follows. According to McGinn, Wittgenstein fell into dogmatism in his early philosophy. But is it not similarly possible to be dogmatic when describing everyday language, and how is the danger of dogmatism to be avoided? It is not clear to me how this issue can be addressed when Wittgenstein's development is characterized in terms of a switch of the object of investigation. (Rather than depending on the content of philosophical statements, dogmatism seems to be a function of the kind of use that is made of such statements.) Finally, if the early Wittgenstein is offering reminders, what do these reminders concern, if not logical distinctions (and so on) present in everyday language use? And if so, is everyday language not the object of investigation in Wittgenstein's early philosophy too?

Despite such questions that one might raise with respect to McGinn's characterization of the status of the Tractatus' statements, her book constitutes a highly interesting contribution to the debate on Wittgenstein's philosophy. Even though I would not agree with Hacker's criticism that resolute readings are in principle forced to throw away the Tractatus' insights about logic, it is a fact that resolute readers have not written much about these issues. Whether or not McGinn's reading should ultimately be characterized as resolute, she has done an important job in showing how a reading that accepts as its starting point Diamond's critique of the traditional interpretation is perfectly capable -- indeed, well positioned -- to describe the Tractatus as a contribution to logic and the philosophy of logic.

On a more personal note, with respect to its elucidation of the Tractatus' views on logic, McGinn's book is pretty much the book on Wittgenstein's early philosophy I always wanted to read as a student, but was never able to find. (Accordingly, with students in mind, one would hope that OUP will soon bring this book out in paperback.) Happily, the book did not come too late for me, and it is certainly not only recommended reading for students. Not only did I learn a great deal from this book, but reading it was also a pleasure.


Conant, James. "The Method of the Tractatus". In Reck, E. G. ed., From Frege to Wittgenstein, Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.

Diamond, Cora. The Realistic Spirit. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 1991.