Embodied Emotions: A Naturalist Approach to a Normative Phenomenon

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Rebekka Hufendiek, Embodied Emotions: A Naturalist Approach to a Normative Phenomenon, Routledge, 2016, 189pp., $143.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138100251.

Reviewed by Erik Myin, University of Antwerp


What is an emotion? Contemporary philosophical treatments of that question (almost) all basically agree that emotions are intentional, world-relating and evaluative. Many theorists further concur with Richard Lazarus' proposal of what emotions are intentionally related to, namely "core relational themes" (or CRTs, see Lazarus 1991). CRTs should be understood as different ways in which aspects of situations relate to the well-being of organisms -- for example, an organism's fear relates to the CRT that something in a situation can have harmful consequences for the organism. Philosophers who agree on the intentional and evaluative nature of emotions have nevertheless diverged widely in their further thinking about what emotions are. On one side of the spectrum stand those allied with cognitivism. Cognitivists tend to emphasize the role of judgment, understood in the sense of fully-fledged propositional attitudes and to downplay the role of bodily processes. At the other end of the spectrum, some enactivist philosophers have argued that at least some forms of emotions are embodied reactions which, while being both intentional and evaluative, nevertheless do not involve representational content (see Hutto 2012, Colombetti 2014).

Rebekka Hufendiek presents and defends a position on emotions which is critical both of existing cognitivist as well as embodied and enactive approaches. She agrees with embodied approaches that cognitivists overintellectualize emotions and neglect the importance of the body. Yet she also is dissatisfied with the main embodied and enactive accounts.

At the heart of Hufendiek's position is a staunch realism about core relational themes. For instance, being dangerous or poisonous forms an objective threat to an organism's survival or well-being. More generally, Hufendiek claims that core relational themes are ontologically real because some themes are objectively good or bad with respect to biological or social norms. Hufendiek further proposes that CRTs are Gibsonian affordances -- a term famously coined by ecological psychologist J.J. Gibson to refer to the possibilities for action that are offered by an environmental object or situation. Expressing her realism in Gibsonian terms, she claims that emotional affordances "constitute the structure of our environment" (p. 174).

Hufendiek understands these objectively existing CRTs as operating in a causal way by exercising selection pressure on organisms (p. 158). Thus, CRT's cause organisms to evolve mechanisms which at the same time represent the CRTs and motivate the organism to act with respect to them. That is to say, organisms develop action-oriented representations, or AORs. These AORs, so Hufendiek argues, are constituted by an organism's evolutionary appropriate embodied reactions to the CRT. Following the standard Millikanesque teleosemantic line, she takes these reactions to represent their evolutionary normal conditions of functioning. Hufendiek further holds that these bodily reactions also are intensional: they represent their CRTs in a certain way. By being or initiating reactions of withdrawal and escape, the bodily reactions of feeling danger are taken to represent danger as "danger-to-be-avoided" (p. 152).

CRTs also have relations to each other. These relations exist as objectively as the CRTs and put pressure on how an organism's emotions relate to each other -- so that when, for example, someone fears losing something, the person is sad when he actually has lost it, and relieved when it is found again (to modify an example from page 175).

This is the basic positive story presented in the book. However, a lot of space is devoted to criticising existing philosophical accounts of emotions, from all parts of the spectrum. Hufendiek makes a strong case for the conclusion that cognitivists look in the wrong place when trying to explain the relations between emotions. Instead of construing these in terms of relations between complex conceptual representations, as per cognitivism, the key to explaining these relations, so Hufendiek holds, lies in the world, and an organism's adaptation to it, either through evolution, or through learning -- the latter especially so when social emotions are at play. She also objects to cognitivism on empirical grounds. Hufendiek cites the fact that young children and animals show complex emotions, which she regards as hard to reconcile with the assumption that emotions involve complex representations. She also thinks the dismissal by cognitivists of a substantial role for bodily processes is unwarranted, given that there is empirical evidence, not for a unique correlation between specific bodily reactions and emotion, but nevertheless for typical dynamically organized complex reaction patterns (p. 75).

Despite turning away from cognitivism's intellectualism, Hufendiek doesn't follow in the footsteps of enactivists, such as Daniel Hutto and Giovanna Colombetti, who see at least some emotions as a matter of embodied sensitivity to something like CRTs, without the intervention of any representational contents. Much of Hufendiek's resistance to these enactivists is based on a complicated argument rooted in her position on CRTs as ontologically real and as causally effective.

I take the gist of her argument against enactivists to be that they construe CRTs as response-dependent properties. As such, enactivists, according to Hufendiek, are unable to account for the structure emotions have with respect to one another. That is, she thinks enactivists are guilty both of construing CRTs in terms of the reactions of organisms to worldly items, and of attempting to explain why the organisms have these reactions by invoking these reactions -- as in explaining why someone laughs with a joke by invoking the laughing itself.

But if this is the argument, then it goes by far too quickly. For even if enactivists do indeed see CRTs as response-dependent -- a claim which Hufendiek admits is drawn from only incidental remarks made by both Hutto and Colombetti -- there are many ways for them to spell out this response dependency without also committing the sort of mistake of which Hufendiek thinks them guilty. They can, for example, draw a distinction between (a) potential reactions, or earlier reactions of the organism's ancestors or the organism itself and (b) actual, current reactions, and explain (b) in terms of (a).

Moreover, it remains unclear how to construe Hufendiek's stark opposition to emotions being response-dependent with central features of her own account. If responses include effects on organisms, then the very idea of CRTs as involving situations to which organisms relate seems to imply response dependence. That is, on a plausible understanding of response dependence, the notion of an absolutely non-response-dependent CRT looks internally incoherent. Time and again, Hufendiek supports her position by claiming that there can be environmental CRTs, which are not (yet) responded to by organisms -- dangers which are feared, poisons which are disgusted or shames which are not felt. But nothing prevents enactivists from acknowledging such CRTs.

Regardless, Hufendiek seems to confer certain causal and explanatory powers to pre-existing CRTs which enactivists don't. She insists that pre-existing CRTs cause organisms to adapt to them, and explain why organisms are adapted to them. Yet this has a pretty Lamarckian ring to it, if the idea is that the possible effects of, for example, danger play a causal role in evolution. It seems to confer a direct guiding role to the environment in evolution and to go against the Darwinian picture of evolution as blind and gradual -- a picture in which only actual historical effects matter in the causation and explanation of adaptations. This point can also be made in terms of affordances. Perhaps there are affordances (being edible, poisonous, dangerous) in the environments of animals. But to construe these affordances as literally causing them to be perceived and acted upon leads to void explanations, such as "coming to see something as dangerous because it is dangerous" -- precisely the kind of void "virtus dormativi" explanation Hufendiek claims to discern in enactivism. Both for evolution and for affordances, what one wants instead is a gradualist story about how organisms eventually come through environmental feedback (by initially reacting blindly, partially or incompletely) to genuinely acquire a sensitivity to complex properties such as danger.[1] In the end, it is the enactivists who, by rejecting the existence of unexplained contents either in the head, or in the world, seem to be the better Darwinians.

Enactivists may also complain that Hufendiek's commitment to representationalism is not sufficiently supported by her arguments. Teleosemantics is simply taken for granted, despite the widespread worry that there's a "root mismatch" between biological function and semantics (see Burge 2010, p. 301). Saying that representationalism is needed because it explains that an emotion can be appropriate or inappropriate in a situation in a semantic sense (as for example on page 106) sounds suspiciously circular as an argument for representationalism. Enactivists may also point out that conferring representational status to emotions is doing no real work in Hufendiek's theory of emotions. For example, accounting for the relations between emotions in terms of adaptation to the structure of the world is perfectly possible without assuming representations. Moreover, it should be noted that no work is in fact done by representations in the adaptive account Hufendiek offers in her book.

The themes touched upon in this review are developed in five chapters, devoted respectively to cognitivism, the role of bodily process, embodied and enactive accounts, the ontology of CRTs and embodied Action-Oriented representations. The book is well organized, and the prose is clear, even if the phrase "accounting for" and all possible forms of "constitute" appear excessively. Though I am of the opinion that the constructive work presented can't support all of the weight of the criticisms offered, it certainly has the merit of applying a number of recently proposed influential ideas in the philosophy of mind and cognitive science to the field of emotions. If the book is seen as an exploration of where these ideas lead, as testing the waters rather than as offering a fully elaborated novel theory of emotions, it can be said to achieve its goals.[2]


Burge, Tyler. 2010. The Origins of Objectivity. Oxford University Press.

Colombetti, Giovanna. 2014. The Feeling Body: Affective Science Meets the Enactive Mind. MIT Press.

Hutto, Daniel. 2012. "Truly Enactive Emotion." Emotion Review 4 (2): 176-181.

Lazarus, Richard. 1991, Emotion and Adaptation, Oxford University Press.

[1] Enactivists will also hold that organisms don't come to contentfully appreciate these properties as danger before they have learned to use language and the socioculturally established norms for the proper use of the word "danger".

[2] I am grateful to Victor Loughlin, Jan Van Eemeren, Karim Zahidi and Farid Zahnoun for feedback on a draft of this review.