Embodied Minds in Action

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Robert Hanna and Michelle Maiese, Embodied Minds in Action, Oxford University Press, 2009, 418pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199230310.

Reviewed by David Robb, Davidson College


This ambitious book presents "the rudiments of a unified treatment of three fundamental philosophical problems: the mind-body problem, the problem of mental causation, and the problem of intentional action" (1). Hanna and Maiese see their approach as revolutionary: if correct, it "presents a new paradigm for contemporary mainstream research in the philosophy of mind and cognitive neuroscience", a "truly radical idea" with "revisionary implications" (ix), "definitely something worth writing home about" (11). Here, they say, is a theory to render the mental "utterly unmysterious" (20) and in a manner so compelling that philosophers will find it "overwhelmingly obvious", if only they can step outside of the "hothouse atmosphere" of current debates in the philosophy of mind (17, 50). For those philosophers seeking a novel conceptual framework to make the mind-body relation intelligible, this, the authors claim, is "with bells onprecisely that needed development" (314).

These remarks herald the Essential Embodiment Theory (EET). It is, to be sure, an imposing philosophical system, articulated with dozens of numbered principles and sub-principles, diagrams, technical terms, and two-, three-, and even ten-way distinctions, all spread over four hundred pages of lively (and frequently demanding) philosophical prose. Contributions come from multiple directions: Aristotle, Descartes, Wittgenstein, Merleau-Ponty, and Sartre weigh in along with Jane Austen, T.S. Eliot, and W.B Yeats. Quantum field theory, dynamic systems theory, the embodied cognition movement, and a non-classical logic complement phenomenology and hylomorphism. EET defies compact, jargon-free summary. Here I can only sketch a few of its central doctrines and try to evaluate its explanatory prospects. I'm not as optimistic about EET as Hanna and Maiese are, but my skepticism is mixed with admiration (and occasional awe) for the philosophical gestalt switch this book aims to produce in its readers.

Start with EET's metaphysics of nature: the Dynamic World (ch. 7). Nature is a single, dynamic system displaying an infinite variety of properties, mutually irreducible yet fused into one network, "an indissoluble holistic blending and an inevitable pluralistic scattering" of diverse facts (319-20). Neither the mental nor the physical is fundamental. Layered ontologies, currently so popular in the philosophy of mind, have fixed on the wrong spatial metaphor: nature is not a hierarchy of levels but "an ontological spiral" in which the physical continuously unfolds, by dynamic emergence, into the biological and mental (318, 327, 371).

The Dynamic World is found on a smaller scale in "minds like ours". This is EET's doctrine of Mind-Body Animalism, outlined in the Introduction and developed throughout the book. We are essentially living, biological beings: self-organizing, thermodynamic, teleologically ordered organisms, instantiating physical, biological, and mental properties, all fused into a "causal-dynamic game of loop-the-loop" (14). As animals, we are continuous with nature. Even our capacity to create our own futures is shared by other "causal singularities" such as weather systems, black holes, and boiling water (261). Nor is mentality confined to our brains: we are conscious "in-and-through" every vital system in our bodies, including the immune and cardiovascular systems, "right out to the skin" (35). Personal/sub-personal and brain/body distinctions are rejected along with soul-body dualism: all draw an arbitrary and static mind-body divide where the human animal is continuous and dynamic.

The Essentially Embodied Agency Theory (chs. 3-5) explains intentional action. Classical causal theories are on the right track, but they miss the distinctive features of embodiment. Observable actions display "an integrated series of dynamic endogenous events". Covert, neurobiological movements are just as much intentional actions as their overt counterparts (102-3). Standard approaches have marginalized actions that should be central: pre-reflective bodily motions such as a subtle shifting of the body while reading a passage, or the movements of a dancer. These come about through "effortless tryings" and continue via active guidance (ch. 4). Here we have seamless and simultaneous integration of reason and action, not the metaphysical gaps said to plague standard causal theories (125). Emotion and desire are central players as well: like mind itself, they are spread throughout the body, and are found in even the most rudimentary forms of human consciousness (ch. 5).

Such is EET in basic outline. Turn now to the mind-body problem: "What explains the existence and specific character of conscious, intentional minds like ours in a physical world?" (1). After the buildup in the book's opening pages, readers will be looking for something special: Will EET close the explanatory gap? Will it naturalize intentionality, or at least explain some of its puzzling features, such as our ability to think about the future, the non-existent, the abstract? What about the thorny problem of misrepresentation? The authors reject any ontological or explanatory reduction of the mental (278, 328), so answers will have to come by some other means. But while there are suggestive remarks throughout the book, the promised revolutionary insights were, for me, elusive.

Consider phenomenal consciousness: how can physical structure -- let it be dynamic, self-organizing, and teleologically ordered as needed -- result in phenomenal feel at all, let alone our sort of phenomenal feel? Why should it be like anything to be an embodied animal? If there's an answer here, it must be pieced together from various elements of EET. For example, our animal lives are said to be subjective in that they take place from an "ego-centrically centered and spatially oriented essential embodiment" (32, 368). But this by itself doesn't tell us why having a point of view in these indexical or spatial ways should be like anything in the relevant sense. There is also the repeated claim that consciousness and intentionality are intimately linked (44, 92), but this representational theory of consciousness (if that's what's being proposed) remains undeveloped, at least as compared to other versions of the theory already in the literature.

More promising is property fusion, the book's central metaphysical notion:

the fundamental mental properties of conscious, intentional mindslo [minds like ours] are non-logically or strongly metaphysically a priori necessarily reciprocally intrinsically related to corresponding fundamental physical properties in a living animal's body (344).

Examples of fused properties include concavity and convexity (304). If we could understand how phenomenal properties are related to physical/biological properties as concavity is to convexity, that would be progress. But while the book moves us in this direction, I can't find in these pages enough to make psychophysical property fusion intelligible, which is what the mind-body problem calls for. The authors say repeatedly that property fusions are a priori, at least in the sense that a priori insight is needed to fill in the gaps left by empirical evidence (332). But the crucial a priori derivations from physical to phenomenal (or vice versa, "spiraling" or otherwise) never appear. Fusion is often asserted but never made transparent.

This may, however, be asking too much of EET, which is presented, not as a theory of mind or consciousness generally, but just as a theory of minds like ours. Yet Hanna and Maiese take consciousness like ours to be necessary and sufficient for mentality (26), so that apparently the mind-body problem and the mind-like-ours-body problem coincide. And in any case, the mystery of consciousness like ours looks as deep as it is for consciousness generally. That said, the restriction proves useful at times, especially in warding off counterexamples. Exotic creatures lacking a body (the spirit, the brain-in-a-vat) or desires (Mr. Spock, the Emotional Zero) are not conscious in the way that we are (49-52, 79-80, 93). Such moves can make EET's modal claims look like innocuous de dicto necessities: necessarily, any consciousness like ours will share features of our consciousness. What's needed are the ambitious de re necessities, and when there is positive support for these, it comes from a familiar source: imagining alternative forms of consciousness is extremely difficult (80, 85). Still, this does not reduce the seemingly arbitrary appearance of consciousness in our animal bodies or in the natural world generally.

It does, however, suggest a more limited role for EET to play in the mind-body problem. Why does phenomenal consciousness take the peculiar form of consciousness like ours? For example, why do we seem to be intermingled with our bodies, as Descartes noted? Or what accounts for the diachronic unity of our conscious lives? EET could illuminate such facts. The strategy in the early chapters works by reverse engineering (11). Some feature of mentality is described from the first-person perspective, occasionally supplemented by science: this is the method of "neurophenomenology". Essential embodiment is then presented as the best way to account for this data. The range of data revealed by neurophenomenology is impressively diverse, and here EET's explanatory resources are on display. How EET compares in this respect with mainstream rivals -- such as brain-based computational views -- is rarely considered, though versions of functionalism are criticized later in the book on more abstract philosophical grounds.

Now for the problem of mental causation. Consciousness may present us with a hard problem, but mental causation is an "Amazingly Hard Problem", a genuine paradox (271-2) generated by three principles (here simplified):

The Causal Efficacy of the Mental (CEM): Mental events can cause physical events.

The Causal Closure of the Physical (CCP): Only physical events can cause physical events.

The Physical Irreducibility of the Mental (PIM): Mental events are non-physical.

Hanna and Maiese take CEM (their version is more elaborate) to be non-negotiable, as it's required by our "basic intuitions about intentional action" which "carry decisively greater rational force" than any metaphysical principles that might be brought against them (273). CCP is secure as well, as it plausibly prohibits Cartesian souls, Platonic forms, and the like from breaking into the physical world (274). PIM is bolstered by eleven arguments, eight drawn from the literature, appealing to multiple realizability, zombies, and the like. Hanna and Maiese don't endorse all eight without qualification, favoring instead three new arguments for irreducibility (280-1). Each appeals to some conceivable -- and so logically possible -- scenario pulling mental properties apart from their would-be reductive bases. The upshot is that CEM, CCP, and PIM all look true, but there is an apparent inconsistency here.

Standard solutions are found wanting. The most prominent of these are from the non-reductive materialists: Fodor, Yablo, Van Gulick, Pereboom, and the Macdonalds are cited. Such views may deliver the explanatory relevance of the mental, but not its causal efficacy. The argument for this is quick (293-4): Take a case in which mental event M allegedly causes physical event P*. According to non-reductive materialists, M nomologically supervenes on some physical base event, P. (Stronger M-P relations, often favored by non-reductive materialists, are not considered here.) Now we can conceive of a "minimal physical duplicate" world stripped of psychological and psychophysical laws, including those connecting M and P. M itself, then, will also be absent. Yet the physical laws in such a world remain the same, leading the authors to conclude that the non-reductive materialist must abandon CEM: "because P on its own causes P* in this minimal physical duplicate of the actual world, it follows that M cannot be doing any causally efficacious work at all in the actual world" (294).

Non-reductive materialists will surely balk here, and insist that M's actual-world efficacy is secured by those very psychological and psychophysical causal laws that were stripped from the alternative world.

In any case, Hanna and Maiese say that "a new solution to the problem of mental causation is urgently required" (294). Their proposal appears at the start of ch. 7:

Nature basically includes complex dynamic organismic life, and essentially embodied mindslo are alive. So because organismic life is basically causally efficacious, then essentially embodied mindslo are basically causally efficacious too. In order to solve the problem of mental causation, you just find mindslo in life, from which it immediately follows that some essentially mental-and-physical complex singular events are jointly sufficient causes of other physical events (295-6).

This raises a number of questions. First, what is it to find minds (like ours -- hereafter understood) in life? This sounds reductionist, but the authors are clear that reduction is not in the cards. Second, how does finding minds in life resolve the apparent inconsistency among CEM, CCP, and PIM? Third, if the biological is also (as the authors think: 347) fundamental and irreducible, isn't its causal status questionable as well, and for the same reasons? If so, how could finding minds in life secure the efficacy of mentality? Fourth, does this proposal deliver the efficacy of mentality as such, or does the efficacy of mental events merely piggyback on that of biological events? (A parallel point could be made with properties.) Fifth, how are the causal powers of the mental related to those of the biological? Are mental powers novel? But this invites worries about overdetermination, not to mention CCP. Are the causal powers shared? But then reductionism looms again. And sixth, in what ways does this proposal give us the promised new paradigm for thinking about mental causation, the "much needed conceptual progress in this area" that the proposal is said to deliver (313-4)?

Some answers come from property fusion, which again plays a central role. In creatures like us, mental, biological, and physical properties are bound together by "inherent or intrinsic connections" (297). This is the sense in which mind is found in life (and in matter). These connections make mental properties physical in the broad sense relevant to CCP (Cartesian souls and Platonic forms are still excluded). Yet mental properties are not fundamentally physical -- this is how we should interpret PIM. Translate these points about properties to events, and the three principles, read correctly, are compatible after all.

Proposals such as this -- on which the mental is, in some way or another, immanent in the physical -- are popular in the mental causation literature. The idea is to bring the mental close enough to the physical so that the mental can do its work in a closed physical world, yet not so close that the mental collapses into the physical, as this would mean reduction. Candidates for such a relation include realization, the determinable-determinate relation, constitution, parthood, strong supervenience, and other brands of metaphysical necessitation. Does fusion save mental causation in a way that these other relations cannot?

One advantage claimed is that the fused properties of an organism form its natural essence (305), while the other relations just listed do not (only strong supervenience is considered). But while several philosophers have drawn connections between causation and essence, here the point takes on the commitments of neo-Aristotelian hylomorphism, and in any case, I found its relevance to the problem unclear. Another claimed advantage is that only property fusion "gives mental properties efficacious causal powers as mental" (311). This would be significant, as all immanence theorists must explain how mental properties can be efficacious in virtue of being mental, not merely in virtue of being immanent in the physical (or biological). Here Hanna and Maiese point us back to the theory of intentional action defended in the book's middle chapters. But while there is plenty of evidence there that the mental is seamlessly integrated with behavior -- on this point, the book is at its strongest -- I did not see there a clear explanation of the mental's efficacy as mental. All of the data appealed to look compatible with the mental's being efficacious only as fused with the physical.

There is much more here than I have been able to look at, such as the theory of action just mentioned and the authors' metaphysics of nature, the Dynamic World. Important as well is the wider context of the embodied cognition movement, the subject of a growing philosophical and scientific literature. EET cannot be fully evaluated without a close look at the empirical prospects of this movement. If there is a revolution, I suspect it will come as much from science as from philosophy.