Embodiment and Agency

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Sue Campbell, Letitia Meynell, and Susan Sherwin (eds.), Embodiment and Agency, Penn State UP, 2009, 277pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271035222.

Reviewed by Emily S. Lee, California State University, Fullerton



I really enjoyed reading this book. Yes, there are stronger and weaker articles, but this anthology predominantly provokes thought on a broad range of topics concerning embodiment and agency. Although a strict dualistic conception of the world is no longer in vogue, this collection importantly addresses how philosophy and society still see and conceptualize the world through the lens of the mind-body, subject-object dualism. Because of our inability to shake off the mantle of such dualistic ideas — though the embodiment of human beings is presently without question — embodied subjects are not recognized as capable of exercising agency. In the introduction, Letitia Meynell points out

insofar as bodily circumstances are relevant to agents’ activities and capacities, traditional theory has treated those whose bodily demands interfere with acting independently and ‘rationally’ … as incapable of fully meeting the criteria for competent agency and, hence, legitimately denied some of the privileges of agents (5).

A consequence of philosophy’s long history of denial that subjects are embodied is the conception of agency as employed by completely autonomous individuals — unburdened by the materiality of embodiment. This collection directs attention to the meaning of embodiment and reconceives the conditions and parameters of agency.

Because women have been historically more readily associated with the body, feminists have been the most vocal in illuminating, problematizing and challenging the predominance of the dualistic framework and the separation of the mind and body. But as Meynell points out “it is fair to say that much feminist theory has engaged the issue of embodiment with an overwhelming focus on how oppressive practices constrain and damage agentic possibilities” (9). This collection insists that some forms (if not all) of agency require embodiment and points to the reconceptions that are necessary in order to understand how embodied beings exercise agency. Such work encourages, if not demands, newly conceiving many features about subjectivity and the social world. Reflecting its broad input, the range of topics in this collection is quite expansive and includes memory, transsexuality, emotion, racial melancholy, self defense, bioethics and global justice. Some articles focus more on the topic of embodiment, while others concentrate on the question of agency. The division of the anthology into two parts, on “Becoming Embodied Subjects” and “Embodied Relations, Political Contexts”, reflects this dual focus.

One of the more interesting conclusions I came to understand upon reading this book involves the sociality or relationality of embodiment and agency. Sue Campbell advocates using the word relationality instead of sociality “to deliberately blur the boundaries between the individual and the collective, between what is held in common and what is most intensely personal” (216). One of the major insights from phenomenology is the notion of being-in-the-world, and as a Maurice Merleau-Ponty scholar, I increasingly focused on the importance of the specificities of embodiment. Ironically, understanding embodiment requires not only more intimate awareness of subjectivity, but also consideration of the integral relation between the subject and others in the social world. Kym Maclaren’s piece, which explains the sociality of emotions, and Campbell’s piece, which addresses the relationality of memory illustrate precisely this point. Despite traditional liberal theory, which conceives of agency as exercised by autonomous individuals, Koggel explains that “relational theory uses as its starting point the fact that human beings exist in relationships and do not come into the world as the independent, autonomous, and self-sufficient agents assumed by many traditional liberal theorists” (252). Hence, even agency, autonomy and, as Susan Sherwin argues, “Personhood is an interactive status that requires social connections with other persons” (150).

In Maclaren’s piece, “Emotional Metamorphoses: The Role of Others in Becoming a Subject”, I found two specific conclusions provoking. Maclaren challenges the specificity of labeling emotions; she writes that “labeling emotions … fails to do justice to the uniqueness of our personal emotional experiences” (29). Maclaren’s work opens up room to more broadly, yet simultaneously uniquely, conceive of emotions. Second, she challenges the internal/external structure of emotion: emotions are not simply internal to the subject. Without such a dualism, emotions lie within one’s interaction with the world. In other words, emotions do not simply arise from subjects’ inability to deal with the world and a subsequent retreat into subjects’ inner sanctum, but are instead an existential endeavor: "we understand emotional tensions as a matter of putting our very reality into question" (33). A strongly felt emotion occurs at the interstices of existentially making sense of one’s world and not simply reacting to a pre-existent world (36). Emotion is far from a mere personal, inner experience; it is a process of structuring one’s world.

Similarly, Campbell’s piece, “Inside the Frame of the Past: Memory, Diversity, and Solidarity”, addresses the relationality of memory — a feature of subjectivity traditionally conceived as internal and private to the subject. Acknowledging that memory is selective and responds to the “demands of the present and future”, Campbell describes how the present can influence, perhaps negotiate memory (213). Describing a child, she writes, “It is through the child’s coming to experience and sequence the past as encouraged to do so by another that the occasion becomes one of joint reminiscence through the participant’s development of a shared perspective” (214). In other words, “what my past is, the description under which I remember and re-experience its events, is partly the unstable consequence of continuously sharing memory with others” (215). Precisely this feature of memory has been used to invalidate children’s memories as evidence in legal cases on child molestation. But instead of taking this as a reason for dismissing memory, Campbell reconceives this function of memory as an opportunity to empower communities by affirming shared values and gaining awareness of non-shared values.

Susan E. Babbitt’s piece, “Collective Memory or Knowledge of the Past: ‘Covering Reality with Flowers’” wonderfully illuminates the force of Campbell’s point. In a way, one can read Babbitt’s piece as directly challenging Campbell’s piece in that Babbitt insists that we cannot primarily rely upon memories of past actions for taking responsibility for the present and directing us into the future. In place of Campbell’s priority on valuing memories of the past — with its attendant danger of naturalizing the past — Babbitt contends that relying upon memories of the past can lead to too comfortably resting in the security of history. Babbitt could be read as challenging the value of remembering, even if remembering in order to rewrite history. Yet, one can also read Babbitt as providing the methodology for how to remember. Babbitt argues that the past should be treated like evidence in the philosophy of science: “evidence only becomes meaningful when it plays a role in the pursuit of specific goals” (235). The past should be drawn from selectively. Babbitt focuses on the existential work of experiencing the present in order to move into a desirable future, a future that is politically conscious and respectful of others.

These articles are fascinating and inspire further thinking. As much as I enjoyed reading them, the range of topics is so expansive that the anthology verges on losing focus. In the second half that addresses mostly agency, exactly what constitutes agency is unclear. Christine M. Koggel’s piece, “Agency and Empowerment: Embodied Realities in a Globalized World”, suggests that the structural global network of circumstances must be acknowledged when one is truly concerned with agency as a process. Much as I share Koggel’s sentiments and conclusions, I need to press her to explain how to determine individual and social responsibility (locally, nationally or globally), especially in the face of such integral connections between the two. If agency is so mired in relationality, it is difficult to determine exactly for which action or result an individual can claim credit or hold blame. I fear the reneging of all accountability.

In the sections on becoming embodied subjects, some articles have a thin sense of embodiment. The articles do not have a common meaning for embodiment. Many of the articles evoke embodiment and their arguments rely upon the importance of embodied subjectivity, but evocations of embodiment do not necessarily suffice for a rich understanding of embodiment, free of the trappings of dualism. Without a deeper conception of embodiment, the articles still falter into a dualism. I found this possibility in Alexis Shotwell’s piece, “A Knowing that Resided in my Bones: Sensuous Embodiment and Trans Social Movement”. Developing Babbitt’s conception of nonpropositional knowledge, a knowledge of “‘intuitions, attitudes, ways of behaving, orientation’”, Shotwell encourages relying upon sensuous knowledge in the body, “a socially situated experience of one’s embodiment” (59, 60). She utilizes the conception of sensuous knowledge as a means for thinking about the trans-sexual movement. She correctly and provocatively posits that the transsexual and transgender movement can bring upon “the political change necessary … [to] create a space other than the gender options now available” (69). Yet Rebecca Kukla’s piece, “The Phrenological Impulse and the Morphology of Character”, which follows Shotwell’s piece, seems to argue against Shotwell’s analysis. Kukla argues that only in a dualistic framework do we have a conception of the body not as lived, but as material, as solely matter. Adhering to such dualism, human beings suffer from the phrenological impulse, “a romantic, teleological picture of the self as fully realized only through the active harmonization of the inner soul with the outer body” (78). The language of the transsexual movement — of harmonization between the inner and the outer self — expresses this phrenological impulse, an impulse representative of dualism. Hence, although Shotwell’s piece aims to challenge dualism, it appears her article has not quite escaped its influences.

This collection will be useful in college-level classes, perhaps not quite for introductory levels, but definitely for more advanced college classes. I intend to use a couple of articles in my 300 level Philosophy of the Body class. It will prove to be an important resource as a secondary source for graduate level philosophy and research. Overall, I highly recommend the book for political philosophy and feminist theory classes.