Embodiment, Enaction, and Culture: Investigating the Constitution of the Shared World

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Christoph Durt, Thomas Fuchs, and Christian Tewes (eds.), Embodiment, Enaction, and Culture: Investigating the Constitution of the Shared World, MIT Press, 2016, 456pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262035552.


Reviewed by Bryce Huebner, Georgetown University


This volume was written at the conclusion of a European research network project called Toward an Embodied Science of InterSubjectivity. Over the course of 20 chapters and an introduction, it develops resources for thinking about embodiment and culture. And since the authors have "collaborated for years" (10), their papers display a great deal of theoretical unity. But unity comes at a cost: nearby stones are left unturned, and competing views are often rejected too quickly. Nonetheless, the book provides a clear account of what enactivism amounts to, what it takes for granted, and how far it can be pushed -- and overall, that's a good thing.


The volume begins with Dermot Moran's analysis of Husserl on embodiment and intersubjectivity, which offer an alternative to Merleau-Ponty's more commonly discussed views. Nicolas de Warren then explores three kinds of social groups that Sartre discusses in his Critique of Dialectical Reason, "one of the most unreadable books of the twentieth-century" (48). Later in the volume, Shaun Gallagher examines the hermeneutical methods of Gadamer, Dilthey, and Schleiermacher; he argues that attention to the differences between these views can clarify the role of interpretation in social cognition. Each of these papers makes substantial contact with broader questions about embodiment, culture, and social cognition. But they are primarily attempts to clarify the views of historical figures, and they feel like they were written for people who are already interested in both enactivism and European Phenomenology. This isn't a bad thing, and it doesn't detract from the high quality of these papers. But people who are interested in European phenomenology may not encounter them, as the volume is focused on the philosophy of cognitive science. People who are concerned with the viability of enactivism may be less interested in these papers, given their historical character. And people working in social ontology, who would benefit most from reading de Warren's paper, are unlikely to pick up this book. Still, I enjoyed learning more about the views of Husserl and Sartre. And doing so was helpful as I read this volume, as several papers draw on this tradition.


Chapters 3-5 address more foundational issues in cognitive science. Ezequiel Di Paolo and Hanne De Jaegher lucidly defend enactivism regarding intersubjectivity. They argue that distinctive forms of participatory sense-making emerge in interactive contexts, and they explain how we cope with shared aspects of our environment. Just as importantly, they show that a dynamic approach to cognition offers a middle way, between global individualism, which treats cognition independent of the body, and global interactionism, which sees all human capacities as embodied. Their argument is fairly programmatic, but it provides the clearest and most compelling overview of enactivism in the volume. Christopher Durt proceeds from a phenomenological perspective. But in a similar vein, he argues that "consciousness discloses aspects of the significance that is established and expressed in cultural behavior" (83), and he contends that culture is constituted by the interactions that are shaped by these forms of significance. He then shows that significance and interaction come in thicker and thinner forms, and he uses this fact to establish that significance is always embodied in behavior, and that embodied consciousness is necessary to integrate all levels of significance (66). Finally, Dan Hutto and Glenda Satne argue that linguistic and cultural technologies can play an important role in the Radically Enactivist project, without compromising the continuity between thinner forms of embodied activity and thicker forms of thought and communication. While they reject teleological theories of content, they argue that such theories provide a plausible foundation for an account of contentless-tracking; and they argue that attunement to social practices opens up the possibility of contentful thought.


This trio of papers usefully clarifies the enactivist project. And by approaching similar issues from different perspectives, they jointly provide more support for enactivism than any of them provide individually. But skeptics are unlikely to be persuaded, as the arguments seem to be consistent with less radical revisions to cognitive science. I find it hard to see what is gained by giving up representations and computations. I agree with Hutto and Satne that biological capacities cannot sustain forms of rule-following that are necessary for propositional content. And like them, I think social behavior is typically guided by capacities for emulation, imitation and regulation, which are "set up, non-accidentally, to target and tune into the expressively rich intentional attitudes of others" (118). Such capacities are unlikely to operate over propositions, but they are the kinds of representational capacities that are routinely posited by cognitive scientists. Accepting them into our ontology does require acknowledging kinds of representations that are not plausibly characterized in the idiom of folk psychological categories. I have always thought that this is precisely what a computational theory of mind requires -- but maybe this means that I'm more sympathetic to the enactivist project than I had previously realized.


I also agree with Di Paolo and De Jaegher that we actively make sense of the world whenever we ride a bike, dance a tango, read a book, or plan to visit a new city. And I agree that drawing any hard-and-fast distinction between these cases would require hefty Cartesian commitments. But where they see dynamics and sense-making, I see simpler forms of representation. So far as I can tell, their strongest argument for abandoning representations occurs in a discussion of a perceptual crossing experiment. In this experiment, some form of biased-sampling is necessary to distinguish between a virtual object and its virtual shadow; and they argue that social interaction:


biases the statistical presentation of sensory stimulus towards much more frequent encounters with the other participant's sensor and not the shadow. Mutual scanning of sensors produces mutual sensory feedback and promotes permanence in the shared spatial region, which is more stable than one participant uni-directionally scanning the shadow of the other (93).


From my perspective, this looks like a mechanism sketch, which could be filled in with details about representations and computations. It's commonly supposed that learning occurs through a dynamic process of generating and updating predictions, using error-driven corrections to track and respond to salient aspects of the environment. Such adaptive capacities, embedded in transactional processes -- as they should be -- would yield the kinds of adaptive behavior that are required by this task. Of course, this would need to be modeled in detail, but it's unclear to me why such a model wouldn't be preferable to one couched in the language of participatory sense-making.


Perhaps the language of sense-making, and the focus on embodiment, gets in the way for people like me, who are open to the possibility of alternatives to computational and representational theories of mind. And if my worries turn on semantic issues, then it's not entirely clear how deep my disagreements with enactivism run. But for now, I think we should look for a middle way between enactivism and traditional approaches to cognitive science. And I think that the most promising place to look in developing such an approach will be in discussions of affordances.


Zuzanna Rucińska provides a rich account of affordances, extending this core idea to the domain of imagining. The first section of her paper canvasses the variety of existing interpretations of affordances, and to explain the sense in which a banana can afford phone-play, she appeals to the way that pretense is grounded in socially-situated practices. Rucińska offers a compelling account of the kinds of cultural attunement that are necessary for pretend play. But again, I had a difficult time understanding why these forms of cultural attunement weren't consistent with forms of error-driven learning, embodied simulation, and other more traditional tools. And I think her arguments would have been even stronger if she had remained non-committal about the mechanisms or processes that sustain affordances. John Elias also provides an account of affordances, but it is less well developed; that said, he provides a useful account of joint affordances, which are grounded in the forms of coordination that allow people to do things together. This is an intriguing idea, and it's one that people should think about, even if they end up appealing to mental representations to explain them. Finally, Thomas Fuchs argues that social habits and capacities are best understood by appeal to collective body memories, which are forms of embodied knowhow. Fuchs contends that in social interactions, "each body forms an extract of its past history of experiences with others that is sedimented in intercorporeal memory" (339). And he suggests that this hypothesis offers a more plausible alternative to computational theories where "the process of learning writes bits of information into memory banks where they are stored and can be recalled at will" (336). Again, I wondered how different this proposal was from the one that we find in mainstream cognitive science. Fuchs seems to think that a computational approach shouldn't appeal to subcortical structures, or to error-driven algorithms. But it was hard for me to see why.


As I noted above, computational theories of mind have become far more dynamic, as capacities for adaptively tracking changes in the environment have taken center stage. The resulting models rarely appeal to richly structured conceptual representations, and they rarely rely on kinds of information that are easily retrievable. Instead, they appeal to things like stored expectations, predictions, and embodied simulations. We see such an approach in Vittorio Gallese's overview of his research program. Gallese focuses on the role of embodied simulations in flexible and adaptive forms of cognition. He argues that capacities for embodied simulation are structured by our encounters with the world, and he suggest that we are able to construct rich social simulations because neoteny (the slowed process of human development) provides humans with heightened capacities for socialization. While I don't agree with all of the details of these proposals, I am convinced by Gallesse's claim that radical forms of enactivism reject a form of representationalism that few cognitive scientists would accept. Understood in this way, Gallese's paper articulates a significant challenge that should have been addressed by many of the other papers in this volume.


Such discussions would have been especially helpful in the four papers that extend the enactivist project to particular cultural phenomena. These papers were provocative, but the arguments were speculative, and they needed further empirical grounding. In most cases, there were traditional resources nearby, which were consistent with the forms of learning and cultural variation that were under discussion, and which could have been used to bolster the claims in these papers. Moreover, engagement with these literatures would have made it clearer what the appeals to embodiment and enaction were adding to the discussion. And more importantly, drawing on these resources could have helped in leading us toward a perspective midway between enactivism and more traditional cognitive science.


Joerg Fingerhut and Katrin Heimann argue that people must learn how to watch film, and they claim that habituating ourselves to film shapes our cognitive capacities in a persisting and pervasive way (354). I'm sure that they're right about the impact of watching film, and their review of the data on watching film exposed me to a number of phenomena that I hadn't encountered before. Furthermore, their approach to aesthetic experience, which highlights the role of learning, strikes me as worth pursuing in more detail. Nonetheless, I wondered how their embodied approach would compare with an approach grounded in more familiar forms of perceptual and evaluative learning. Such views would accommodate the forms of socio-cultural embedding that are necessary to make sense of learning to watch film, and they would provide a link between perceptual and evaluative learning. An enactivist approach may be better suited to explain these phenomena, but the authors don't engage with these alternatives, and their reliance on the enactive and embodied framework makes their project feel more speculative than it needs to be.


Peter Henningsen and Heribert Sattel address cultural differences in the experience of stress and pain. They argue that "culturally shaped ways of world-making influence the interpretation and labeling of and the treatment strategies for distress" (380). And while I would like to believe that this is the case, their discussions of cultural differences are insufficient to motivate any large scale hypothesis. They may be right that a plausible understanding of chronic pain must make reference to group-level social and affective phenomena; but it would take more data to demonstrate that this is the case. The paper by Laurence Kirmayer and Maxwell Ramstead resonates with this approach, going deeper into the details of a cultural approach to psychiatry. Unfortunately, this paper remains fairly abstract, and it doesn't do enough work to explain why its approach is preferable to other models of cultural psychology. But it did make me want to read more work from this research group.


Finally, Duilio Garofoli defends radical enactivism as an approach to archaeological data. This paper was highly speculative, but perhaps it had to be. I have no idea what it would take to show that Neanderthals engaged in symbolic activities, or that they were cognitively equivalent to modern humans. But the claim that body ornamentation doesn't require sophisticated cognition doesn't get us far, even if it happens to be right. To me, this paper thus served to clarify one of the critical limitations of radical enactivism: the fact that some pattern of behavior is consistent with an enactive explanation doesn't demonstrate that enaction is taking place; and in this respect, the radical enactivists may be no better off than the representationalists that they criticize.


There were two additional papers which target foundational issues in cognitive science, but which didn't fit into the narrative I've suggested above. Mark Bickhard provides an overview of his account of emergence, personhood, and the normativity of representation. His argument proceeds at a high level of abstraction, and this was unfortunate, since his paper pushed back against the anti-representational consensus in this volume. Finally, Alba Montes Sánchez and Alessandro Salice attempt to answer the question: "how is it possible for anyone to feel ashamed of what someone else does or says?" To the best of my knowledge, this question hasn't been discussed previously. But it raises important ideas about cultural variation in emotional states, and its interpersonal perspective on emotion makes it a fun read. I wasn't fully convinced of the existence of hetero-induced shame, but this may be an effect of growing up in a slightly different culture than the authors. And since they make a strong case for thinking about the experience of emotion as socially situated, I would strongly recommend this paper to anyone who's interested in thinking about the role of self-understanding, and the role of emotion, on in moral psychology.


Four additional papers address Dan Zahavi's claim that experience always has a first-personal character. These papers share the broadly phenomenological perspective taken elsewhere in the book; but they have the character of a mini-symposium, which can be read independently. Three papers deal with challenges to Zahavi's view; the fourth offers a brief reply by Zahavi. This structure felt odd, as nothing similar occurs elsewhere in the volume. But this was my favorite cluster of papers. They collectively clarify the difficulties that must be addressed by anyone who wants to defend a socially-situated theory of the self. And since they engage directly with Zahavi's views, they could be fruitfully used in a seminar on the self, or in a seminar on phenomenology.


The first paper begins by addressing Hans Bernhard Schmid's claim that social interaction requires a conceptually basic form of plural self-awareness (and knowledge of Schmid's alternative is helpful in seeing the critical import of this paper). Ingar Brinck, Vasudevi Reddy, and Dan Zahavi agree with Schmid that we-experiences often emerge pre-reflectively (141). However, they contend that such experiences must be built up through patterns of mutual engagement. Drawing on data from developmental psychology, they argue that neonates possess a minimal sense of self, as well as a sense of their social partners, and they argue that we-relationships must be established "through dyadic interactions" (138), which presuppose more fundamental I-you relationships. Their goal is to show that the experience of self is conceptually and developmentally prior to plural self-awareness. Anna Claunica and Alkaterini Fotopoulou reject this claim, arguing that the even the minimal self must be socially constructed. Focusing on the role of interoception in embodied self-awareness, they argue that affective touch plays a causal role in shaping our sense of body-ownership, and produces the distinction between self and other. This hypothesis is consistent with recent work on the centrality of allostatic and interoceptive processing to cognition (Kleckner et al 2017). However, there isn't enough evidence to support this hypothesis. And more importantly, the argument misfires: even if the embodied sense of self is constructed interpersonally, it doesn't follow that the subjective character of experience is inherently interpersonal (197).


Matthew Radcliffe addresses the subjective character of experience more directly, and so his view does seem to offer a more robust reply to Zahavi. He argues that we are typically aware of what kind of mental state we're in. But just as importantly, we assume that interpersonal feedback will confirm our understanding of experience, and, in typical contexts, feelings of trust and expectations of consensus are constitutive features of such experiences. But according to Radcliffe, these feelings and expectations can be compromised by trauma and isolation, and this can trigger psychotic experiences that feel self-less (or, perhaps more accurately, differently selfed). He thus claims that a plausible explanation of some kinds of schizophrenic experience will rely on a relational account of minimal selfhood, to accommodate the ways that these kinds of effects emerge. And just as importantly, he argues that this gives us good reason to treat the basic sense of self as "developmentally dependent on interactions with other people" (150). Put much too simply, since a change in the relational features of subjective experience can trigger psychosis, this suggests that those relational features are at least partially constitutive of typical forms of subjective experience.


I found Radcliffe's argument compelling, and there is more subtlety and ingenuity to his argument than I have mentioned here. I'm not sure that he's right, but I'm sure that his argument is worth thinking about in more detail. Specifically, I think there is good reason to think carefully about the nature of depersonalized and derealized experience, and I applaud Radcliffe's way of approaching these phenomena relationally, as I agree that individualist approaches to these phenomena leave much to be desired. Finally, it is worth noting that Zahavi sees these forms of relational selfhood as important elaborations of the minimal self, and his reply to Radcliffe, along with his reply to the paper by Brinck and her colleagues, provides a way of thinking about different ways that first-personal experience can be fleshed out as a result of interpersonal interactions.


Having read this book, I remain ambivalent about enactivism, though I see great value in the phenomenological approach that undergirds most of the papers. I agree that people attune to patterns of action and interaction. But I'm apprehensive about the claim that bodily states play a constitutive role in cognition. And I'm skeptical of attempts to replace representations and computations with claims about dynamical systems and participatory sense-making. Dynamics are cool, and we do actively create the world we experience. But it isn't clear to me why appeals to dynamics preclude the existence of mental representations, and it isn't clear to me that dynamics and sense-making are the right place to look for explanations of culturally salient phenomena. We treat people as members of ingroups and outgroups, we track prestige and social status, and we attribute essential characteristics to people. I know roughly how to explain these phenomena in terms of representations and computations. But even after reading this book, I'm less sure what an enactivist should say about them, and I still wonder about the added value of adopting an enactivist approach to these phenomena. Nonetheless, I remain open to the possibility that I'm missing something deep and important, and I look forward to reading more research on enaction, embodiment, and culture.




Thanks to Carl Sachs and Ruth Kramer for helpful feedback on this review.




Kleckner, I., Zhang, J., Touroutoglou, A., Chanes, L., Xia, C., Simmons, W., Quigley, K., Dickerson, B., and Feldman Barrett, L. (2017). Evidence for a large-scale brain system supporting allostasis and interoception in humans Nature Human Behaviour, 1 DOI: 10.1038/s41562-017-0069.