Embryology, Epigenesis, and Evolution: Taking Development Seriously

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Robert, Jason Scott, Embryology, Epigenesis, and Evolution: Taking Development Seriously, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 174 pp., $60 (hbk), ISBN 0521824672.

Reviewed by Stuart A. Newman, New York Medical College


Commenting on a period in which debate raged about the nature of physical reality and the role of theory in accounting for it, Louis Althusser observed that such episodes tend to be set off when a new science has come into being and “idealist” forces devoted to subsuming its findings to old categories begin to contend with “materialist” forces struggling to assert the existence of a new theoretical “object.” The world of physics of the late 19th-early 20th century that was unleashing phenomenalists, conventionalists, positivists and realists of various stripes, was one in which the Newtonian framework had been shaken by thermodynamics and electricity and magnetism, but relativity and quantum mechanics had yet to be heard from. Althusser’s insight, however, pertained not to a finished scientific product, but to an emergent one: the new physics in the process of being born challenged, and would increasingly challenge, the idea of a clockwork universe of scale-independent causality. Which notions of reality had to be given up and which could be saved?

From the evidence in Jason Scott Robert’s excellent new book, the biology of the present period is at a similar juncture. This turn of events is not entirely unacknowledged by biologists themselves. But in contrast to physics, which presents itself unabashedly in the forms of theories and revolutions thereof, the self-narrative of biology has de-emphasized speculation and epistemological breaks, apart from the handing down, a century and a half ago, of the two stone tablets of Mendelism and Darwinism. So while the “gene” (or factor) in the sense characterized by Mendel is barely discernable in the complex of dynamical processes by which the features of an organism are constructed during embryonic development, or are passed from generation to generation (admittedly, there is occasionally a one-to-one correspondence between a mutation and a morphological alteration, but even these rare cases are usually mechanistically uninformative at the level of an organismal character), most biologists would probably identify “Mendelism” as a central tenet of their science. And even though accounts of macroevolution—transitions between structurally distinct motifs of body organization—alternative to Darwin’s natural selection of incremental variants are increasingly discussed, the term “Darwinism” continues to be synonymous with modern evolutionary biology in much academic, and virtually all popular, discourse.

Robert enters this fray not as an explicit critic of Mendelism or Darwinism (the actual practice of evolutionary-developmental biology, with which he is intimately familiar, has moved well beyond this), but as a critical analyst of the various ways in which the current ferment is being handled conceptually. Few contemporary philosophers would likely adopt the Marxist Althusser’s stark dichotomization and characterize the current debate as a struggle being between idealism and materialism. Vitalism, a once-fashionable form of biological idealism with a visible philosophical and scientific following at least into the 1960s, has largely been banished, and certainly none of the working philosophers and scientists Robert discusses here would consider themselves as anything but materialists.

But something in Althusser’s formulation continues to strike a chord. Living matter is like no other, and the current scientific attempts to grapple with it do run a gamut ranging from subsuming it to standard, pre-existing categories of (chemical, molecular, “informational”) matter (i.e., one of a variety of reductionisms) to striving to formulate principles specific to a new theoretical object (e.g., a “developmental system” according several of the perspectives discussed by Robert). The critique Robert brings to bear, moreover, on notions at the reductionist end of this gamut (“genetic informationism,” “genetic animism” and “genetic primacy”), makes it clear that the “genetic programs” required to implement the modern consensus which is based on these elements are a matter of faith, and come perilously close to having the character of idealist demiurges.

The author is fair to his intellectual opponents. No developmental biologist really believes that genes do it all, i.e., that development is anything other than “hierarchical, characterized by the emergence of structures and processes not predictable (let alone explicable) from lower-level (e.g., genetic) properties of the embryo” (p. 14). But beyond this agreement important distinctions can be made. On the one side is the notion that, all things being equal, specific traits will be caused by specific genes. (This view is generally accompanied by the assertion that “background” or contextual factors—the embryo’s environment, the laws of chemistry, the physical forces that contribute to morphogenesis of body structures—are, for all intents and purposes, constant). A more nuanced view, which Robert traces back to J. H. Woodger’s writings in the 1950s, is the “constant factor principle” heuristic, which problematizes the assumption of contextual constancy. This points in the direction of experimental designs (an example in reproductive biology is provided; p. 21) that reiteratively interrogate the effect of changes in one system level (e.g., the endocrinological) on another (e.g., the behavioral). Even further in the direction favored by the author are investigations that bring multiple disciplines to bear on developmental causation. Here he discusses a series of interlinked studies on the “eyespots” of the butterfly wing (p. 21) in which these patterns are accounted for by a multileveled approach that draws on population genetics, evolutionary theory, ecology, developmental genetics, and experimental embryology.

Such investigations, which (in the words of the book’s subtitle) take development seriously, represent, for Robert, the “way forward” in biology. His preferred name for this program, which has acknowledged affinities to characterizations put forward with increasing force in the last few years by a variety of biologists and philosophers of biology, is “constitutive epigenetics.” He states that “epigenetic events are developmental interactions within the whole cell-organism in its developmental context, between any and all such factors as cytoplasmic structures, DNA sequences, mRNA, histone- and non-histone proteins, enzymes, hormones, positional information, paternal effects, and metabolites” (p. 74). While laudably comprehensive, this list should appropriately also include the physics of condensed materials, probably the most important set of formative determinants in the generation of embryonic form and pattern, but which is often mistakenly considered part of the constant background. In agreement with “developmental systems theory” (DST), one of the more energetically propounded philosophical critiques of genetic determinism, Robert sees the information which in standard accounts is embodied, or encoded, in genes, as being generated epigenetically. This is true as far as it goes, but as I will argue below, by extending this formulation to consider the particular role of genetic change in choosing and consolidating developmental pathways over the course of evolution, it may be possible to understand why a fixation on the gene has taken developmental biology as far as it has.

It is illuminating to consider how biology arrived at the peculiar but widely held set of precepts (often in conflict with actual scientific practice) that embryonic development is a manifestation of lock-step programs written in the language of genes, and that such programs were assembled by random accretion of changes in the meanings of the words in this very language. On the basis of its formal structure alone, an analogous set of beliefs would be written-off as myopic, or worse, in any of the physical sciences. Explanations in the areas of superconductivity, cosmology, and fluid turbulence all draw on multiple processes at many scales, and these phenomena are less, not more, complex than cells and embryos. Robert provides a useful capsule history of the strategic and productive decisions made at the beginning of the 20th century by Thomas Hunt Morgan and other pioneers of cytogenetics to (provisionally) sever the study of the transmission of genes from the generation of characters, so that “[b]y the 1930s, only embryologists took embryology seriously” (p. 58). Embryology remained a scientific backwater until (with the emergence of molecular genetics) the field, in its new incarnation as “developmental biology,” became intimately identified (at least in its high-profile, most fundable form) with the study of differential gene expression.

In the bacteria and bacteriophages in which the genetic code and mechanics of gene expression were originally worked out, there was often a reasonably transparent correspondence between the production of one or a small set of proteins and a definable trait. In the development of multicellular organisms, however, things were much more complicated. The frustration of scientists attempting to understand the morphogenesis of bodies and organs simply on the basis of “genes talking to genes” became palpable in the last quarter of the 20th century. This led to scientific strategies, marginal at first, but increasingly mainstream, that took a more systems-based, or integrative, approach. It also led to historical and philosophical critiques of the standard model by analysts of developmental biology, such as those of the group associated with DST, mentioned above, and others, including Robert in earlier papers and the book under review. It took the sequencing of the fruit-fly, mouse, and human genomes at the beginning of our own century, and the failure of the promised “blueprints” for development to materialize, for the funding agencies, major universities (by establishment of centers) and, for better or worse, biotechnology corporations, to sign on to “systems biology.”

Robert is a strong advocate of the research program of evolutionary-developmental biology (evo-devo), a broad set of scientific activities which, though lacking a central core of tenets like, for example, DST, has the advantage of having a number of active cell- and tissue-level developmental biologists among its theorists. He suggests that evo-devo has much to learn from DST (e.g., recognition of multiple levels of causation) and vice-versa (e.g., serious consideration of the evolution of developmental mechanisms). However, in characterizing the notion of the gene common to some versions of DST and his own “constitutive epigenetics,” he states: “[G]enes do not precede development but are rather constructed during development…perhaps we would do well to stop taking about genes in development altogether and instead focus on the generative processes of development as such” p. 119). I find this questionable.

One can fully agree with downplaying genes as efficient causes in the production of organismal form but still recognize that living matter contains an imprint of its evolutionary history (in a way that other matter, regardless of how complex, does not), and that gene sequences are the major carriers of this imprint. Developmental systems as characterized by Robert inevitably have many degrees of freedom and many possible condition-dependent phenotypes. (Their counterparts earlier in the evolution of multicellular forms most likely exhibited even greater plasticity.) Versions of the same developmental system that differ in the sequence of one or more genes will often display a different set of the system’s possible phenotypes, or a different range of them under a given range of environments (“norm of reaction”). This is not because the genes, or gene variants, determine the phenotypes. Rather, by altering the system’s composition in an inheritable way, they influence the dynamics and thus indirectly modify the developmental outcomes. Iterating this effect over many generations will eventually produce reproductively isolated populations of morphologically distinct organisms, i.e., evolution. The parallel accumulation of genetic and phenotypic changes over the course of evolution has produced systems in which the study of hierarchies of genetic interactions during development (a scientifically useful project) can, to the dismay of epigeneticists, deceptively stand in for the study of development itself.

While any constitution of a developmental system as a “theoretical object” (in Althusser’s sense, mentioned above) cannot ignore this crucial aspect, the dynamical, multicausal framework expounded in this exceptionally lucid book will lend itself to taking seriously not only development, but evolution as well.