Emergence in Mind

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Cynthia Macdonald and Graham Macdonald (eds.), Emergence in Mind, Oxford University Press, 2010, 286pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199583621.

Reviewed by Philip Goff, University of Hertfordshire


There is much work to be done on the topic of emergence in philosophy of mind. The essays in this volume make some considerable headway. The volume contains a great variety of essays, from Philip Pettit's article concerning the possibility of rationality in group agency, to Robin Findley Hendry's discussion of emergence and reduction in chemistry, to Achim Stefan's contribution on the relationship between emergentism and free will. Many of the papers are followed by a critical response from another philosopher.

I will focus here on two broad themes -- the characterisation of emergence and Kim-style worries about causal exclusion -- each of which is dealt with in a number of the essays, and comment on the progress that has been made and the work still to be done.

I. How should we characterise emergence?

Emergent properties are higher-level properties which are 'genuinely metaphysically novel' or 'something over and above' the base from which they emerge. In contrast, higher-level but non-emergent properties, although they may be distinct from any properties at the fundamental level are nonetheless 'nothing over and above' the fundamental facts. Of course the problem is all these phrases in scare quotes cry out for clarification.

There is a strong philosophical tradition, from Donald Davidson onwards, of characterising the relationship between mental and physical in terms of supervenience. We might attempt to distinguish emergent from non-emergent properties in line with this tradition, as Paul Noordhof does in his contribution to the volume. Let us suppose that the relationship between higher-level properties and their metaphysical base in a given world is one of supervenience. We can then hold that whether or not a given property is emergent is a matter of the modal strength of its supervenience on its base (let us call such a view 'the modal account of emergence'):

The Modal Account of Emergence

In world W, higher-level property P is emergent from metaphysical base B iff P supervenes on B with merely nomological necessity (any minimal B-duplicate world of W which contains the same laws of nature as W contains an instantiation of P).

In world W, higher-level property P is not emergent from metaphysical base B iff P supervenes on B with metaphysical necessity (any minimal B-duplicate of W contains an instantiation of P).

There is a much discussed counterexample to this traditional understanding of emergence. Some metaphysicians, let us call them 'property causalists', think that the nature of each and every property is characterised in terms of the causal powers it endows to those objects which have it, for example, the nature of mass might be given by the powers it endows to its possessors to resist acceleration, attract other massy things, etc. Consider the following form of property causalism, which we can call 'property causalist emergentism': each fundamental particle has a property P, which is essentially such that when a large number of P-instantiating things are arranged M-wise, they causally bring about higher-level consciousness of a certain kind.

Causal essentialist emergentism entails that the macro-level mental facts supervene with metaphysical necessity on the micro-level facts: in any possible world where P-instantiating things are arranged M-wise, they causally bring about conscious minds. But it is not a view we would want to describe as one which entails that the macro-level mental properties are 'nothing over and above' the micro-level facts; it is a view according to which the macro-level mental properties are causally brought into being by the micro-level facts and what is causally brought into being is surely ontologically extra to that which causally brings it into being. The nothing over and above relation is more intimate than the causally bringing about relation.

Noordhof's article attempts to defend the modal account of emergence from this kind of counterexample. Noordhof offers two responses, neither of which seem to me satisfactory. Firstly, he argues that the fact that properties are characterised in terms of their causal role does not entail that each property has the same causal profile in all possible worlds in which it exists. It is not inconsistent to hold both (i) in each world in which property P exists, there is nothing more to its nature than the causal role it endows to its possessors, and (ii) the causal role P endows to its possessors in W1 differs from the causal role it endows to its possessors in W2. The counterparts of objects in different worlds perhaps need to be qualitatively similar, but need not be qualitatively identical. In the same way, perhaps the causal profiles of property counterparts need to be similar, but do not need to be exactly the same.

If Noordhof is right about this, then he has succeeded in showing that not all metaphysical hypotheses involving property causalism are counterexamples to the modal account of emergence. But nothing he says gives us any reason to think that there are not some metaphysical hypotheses involving property causalism which are counterexamples to the modal account of emergence. And it seems that there are such hypotheses: I gave one above.

Secondly, Noordhof suggests that there is something strange about holding that physical properties might be essentially such as to causally bring about non-physical properties. If a particle is essentially such as to bring about ectoplasm, does that not entail that it does not have a wholly physical nature? Again, even if Noordhof is right about this, it doesn't really get round the counterexample. We want a distinction between emergent and non-emergent properties which has general application: it ought to be able to tell us, for any higher-level property P and any supervenience base B, whether or not P is emergent relative to B. Regardless whether or not the micro-level facts in the above example count as 'physical' or not, the modal account gives the wrong answer to the question of whether the higher-level properties are emergent relative to those facts. Perhaps, for the reasons Noordhof gives, we cannot make sense of a kind of emergentism with only physical properties in the supervenience base, where the modal strength of the supervenience of the emergent properties on the physical base is metaphysical necessity. Still, the above counterexample holds -- it is just not a kind of emergentism with only physical properties in the base -- and hence the modal account of emergence is inadequate.

Tim Crane, in his contribution, tries to distinguish between emergentism and physicalism in terms of explanation. Crane holds that physicalists are obliged to give either an 'ontological reduction' or an 'explanatory reduction' (or both), where these terms are defined as follows:

Ontological reduction: All entities (objects, properties, relations, facts, etc.) belong to a subclass of physical entities.

Explanatory reduction: All truths (particular truths, or general theoretical truths or laws) can be explained in principle in terms of broadly physical truths. (p. 30)

I don't believe that Crane's criterion is sufficient for physicalism, and I worry it may not be necessary either.

Let me state first the doubts concerning Crane's criterion being necessary for physicalism. Consider the view that there is an a posteriori identity between phenomenal qualities and functional qualities: functional concepts and phenomenal concepts are logically distinct, but each phenomenal concept happens to co-refer with some functional concept. This view does not entail an ontological reduction between the phenomenal and the physical: phenomenal qualities are not a subclass of physical qualities, rather they are functional qualities that are realised by physical properties. Does this view entail an explanatory reduction? I'm not sure. Certainly, there is no a priori entailment between the physical facts and the phenomenal facts, given the logical distinctness of functional and phenomenal concepts.

Crane does allow that the relevant kind of explanation may not be a matter of a priori entailment, but he seems uncertain as to whether identities can be involved in explanatory reductions: 'an identity theory itself might be such an explanation, so long as asserting an identity between A and B is a way of explaining why A is B. This is, however, somewhat controversial.' (p. 32)

Of course the identification of A with B can be of explanatory value, but it is not clear to me how the identification of A with B could explain why A is B, given that to say that A is identical to B just is to say that A is B (where 'is' expresses identity). Suppose there is an a posteriori identity between the feeling of pain and the functional property of having a state that plays the pain role. For there to be such an identity is for the phenomenal concept feeling pain to pick out one and the same state as the functional concept 〈having a state that plays the pain role〉. What can we say to explain why the one state is the other state? We can say we have a situation in which one state is picked out by two concepts, and we can give a semantic account of how each concept picks out that state. But we cannot explain why that one state is what it is, i.e., is identical to itself.

The kind of a posteriori physicalism I outline above does, in its way, have a way of explaining the supervenience of pain feelings on c-fibres -- pain is identical to the functional property of having a state that plays the pain role, and c-fibres firing plays the pain role -- but I'm not sure that this explanation, because it involves an a posteriori identity, is one which for Crane would constitute an 'explanatory reduction'. If not, then the satisfaction of Crane's criterion is not necessary for physicalism.

I turn now to why I don't think Crane's criterion is sufficient for physicalism. Let me start with an example which does not directly concern physicalism. Consider God's willing that there be light, resulting in light. We can explain the truth that there is light in terms of the fact that God willed that there be light. Indeed, the fact that there is light is a priori entailed by the fact that God, an essentially omnipotent being, willed that there be light. So if Crane intends explanatory reduction in general to be sufficient for nothing over and aboveness (and again, surely it is reasonable to expect an account of nothing over and aboveness to have general application beyond the definition of physicalism), then this constitutes a counterexample to his view. Nothing over and aboveness is more intimate than supervenience, and it's even more intimate than a priori entailment.

Moreover, there seems to me nothing incoherent about an emergentist view in which there is an a priori entailment between the emergent properties and their ontological base. Just as there is a priori entailment between the fact that God wills that there be light and the fact that there is light, even though the latter fact is clearly an addition in being relative to the former, perhaps there is a priori entailment between the physical facts and the mental/biological facts, even though the latter are an addition in being relative to the former. The thesis that the essential nature of fundamental entities fits them to constitute mental or biological entities, in such a way that God could deduce from the nature of fundamental entities that -- in certain arrangements -- they will constitute mental/biological entities, seems to me consistent with the thesis that mental entities are something over and above physical entities.

We can think of physicalism as the view that reality is all on one level: the physical level. There may be chemical, biological, mental and sociological facts, but these facts are -- in some sense to be clarified -- nothing extra to the physical facts. This view can be opposed in two ways. Horizontal anti-physicalists agree with physicalists that reality is all on one level but believe that there are non-physical things on that level. Substance dualism can be seen as a horizontally anti-physicalist view: the belief that there are non-physical minds as well as particles on the ground floor (and perhaps only floor) of the world. Vertical anti-physicalists think that reality, like a wedding cake, comes divided up into distinct layers. Each layer of being is grounded in lower layers, entities at each higher layer being constituted of the entities at the layer directly beneath. Perhaps the constitution is brute and inexplicable. But perhaps it is explicable and predictable for those who understand the nature of the fundamental entities. Both brute and explicable constitution are consistent with higher-level layers being metaphysically extra to lower-level layers.

I think we need a place for an emergentist picture in which there is intelligible, predictable a priori entailment, and hence supervenience with metaphysical necessity, between fundamental and emergent entities. If this is right, then we must reject both Noordhof's and Crane's characterisation of emergence.

I would like to finish this section by suggesting that recent developments in metametaphysics may give us an alternative place to look for a characterisation of emergence. Theodore Sider (2009) tries to make sense of the idea of a possible language with a metaphysically elite quantifier: a quantifier which, when unrestricted, 'carves nature at the logical joints'. If we can make sense of this idea, then we can perhaps use it to distinguish between physicalism and emergentism. A first shot would be: physicalism is the view that all and only physical entities are ranged over by the elite quantifier; emergentism is the view that certain higher-level entities, as well as fundamental entities, are ranged over by the elite quantifier. I have a concern about the clarity of Sider's characterisation of the elite quantifier; nonetheless this seems a potentially profitable direction of enquiry.[1]

II. Kim-style worries about causal exclusion

Higher-level properties, whether emergent are not, are in some sense realised by or dependent on what is going on at more fundamental levels. But if we suppose, as many are inclined to, that the physical level is causally closed -- for every physical event there is a sufficient physical cause -- how do those higher-level properties which are not identical to physical properties ever get to cause anything? It is arguably part of common sense that my pain causes my desire to get away. But there is good reason to think that if my pain causes my desire, then it does so in virtue of causing the physical property on which my desire is dependent, call that property 'P*'; for if my pain directly caused my desire, then there would be two explanations of the existence of my desire (first explanation: its being caused by my pain, second explanation: its being realised by P*). But, given the causal closure of the physical, P* has a physical cause, call it 'P'. If we are to avoid P* being overdetermined, being caused both by P and by my pain, it looks like we must either give up our commitment to the causal efficacy of pain or our commitment to the causal closure of the physical.

These worries concerning the causal efficacy of higher-level properties are most associated with Jaegwon Kim. Avoiding, or at least limiting, the force of Kim's concerns is the aim of many of the essays. In their contribution, Timothy O'Connor and John Ross Churchill re-construe the Kim-style line of argument as containing an explicit commitment to a causal power ontology, according to which causation is a real relation, irreducible to more fundamental features of reality:

If we accept something like the counterfactual analysis of causation, there is nothing strange or objectionable about deeming M [a mental state, such as my pain], as well as P, to be the cause of P*. For in doing so we are not making a commitment to anything additional: M's status as a cause of P* falls out of facts that we already accept, along with our analysis. It comes for free. By contrast, on the non-reductive-productive account, we should be positing an additional fundamental relation between M and P*, when doing so is entirely unnecessary for accounting causally for P*. (p. 48)

To expand on their line of reasoning, if causation is simply a matter of certain regularities obtaining, or certain counterfactuals being true, then it is difficult to see why overdetermination is a concern. So long as the relevant regularities obtain/counterfactuals hold between both P and P*, and between my pain and P*, then two causal stories can both co-exist in harmony. There is no need to suppose that the two stories need compete to be the real causal story. It is only if we take causation to be an irreducible relation of one event bringing another into existence that overdetermination becomes difficult to make sense of. If there is a complete explanation at the physical level of what brought P* (or my desire to get away) into existence, then an explanation of P*'s existence (or of the existence of my desire) in terms of my pain seems redundant.

If O'Connor and Churchill are right, then this is a significant development in philosophical thinking about mental causation, because it implies that Humeans about causation are not subject to causal exclusion worries. Although O'Connor and Churchill don't explicitly make the point, this could be seen as a significant point in favour of a Humean understanding of causation. Case in point, Peter Menzies and Christian List, in one of the finest essays in the volume, show how James Woodward's interventionist Humean conception of causation can avoid concerns about overdetermination. The elegant way in which it gets around Kim-style concerns makes the interventionist view very attractive.

But suppose for one reason or another we are signed up to non-Humeanism about causation. Is there any way then to avoid Kim's worries? Well we might think that irreducible higher-level properties are merely causally explanatory, rather than genuinely causally efficacious; David Papineau makes a strong case for this in his contribution. But suppose for one reason or another we are also signed up to certain higher-level properties being genuinely causally efficacious. For the remainder of this discussion I will consider whether the following two propositions are consistent in spite of Kim-style concerns: (A) there is genuine non-Humean causation at both the physical level and at higher levels, (B) every physical event has a sufficient physical cause (so for the rest of the discussion I will assume a non-Humean conception of causation).

A couple of the authors attempt to show that (A) and (B) are consistent. Macdonald and Macdonald offer an interesting proposal. They take properties to be abstract universals, which have causal effects only in virtue of having events as instances; the fundamental causal relation is between events understood as instances of properties, rather than between properties. Crucially, they think a given instance can be an exemplifying of more than one property: specifically, a single event can be the exemplifying of both a mental and a physical property. Kim ties himself in knots wondering how both my pain and P can be the cause of P* (to remind ourselves of the example, P is the physical cause of P*, and P* is the physical event that realises my desire to get away). But for the Macdonalds, what is ultimately causing P* is neither my pain nor P, but a single event which is an instance of both my pain and P. In virtue of the fact that an instance of my pain and P is the cause of P*, both my pain and P are causes of P*. As they put it, 'there is no distinction of levels of instances, only levels of properties; at the level of instances, the world is flat.' (p. 156)

I am not persuaded that the Macdonalds' suggestion makes progress on the causal exclusion issue. Even granting that the fundamental relata of causation are events rather than properties, events surely cause what they do in virtue of the qualities that they are instances of. Returning to the above example, here is one complete explanation of the existence of the instance of P*: the instance of P caused the existence of an instance of P* in virtue of being an instance of P. The trouble is, if my pain is distinct from P, then it looks like we have a rival explanation of the existence of P*: the event that happens to be an instance of P caused the existence of the instance of P* in virtue of being an instance of my pain. Now perhaps you don't have the intuition that overdetermination is a worry (although most do), but if the overdetermination in Kim's original argument stressed you out, then the overdetermination that results from these two rival explanations of P*'s existence is going to stress you out just as much.

Noordhof (p. 82) tries to justify what he calls the 'transmission of causality principle', which is roughly the principle that if event C causes event E and some other event C* supervenes on C, then C* also causes E. Obviously, if this principle can be justified, then the exclusion worries are avoided: given that my pain supervenes on P, if P is a cause of P*, then so is my pain. (Please note the typo in the formal description of the principle on p. 82 -- the '6' should be an entailment sign -- which caused me a good 90 minutes of confusion!)

There are two broad strategies Noordhof adopts for justifying this principle. Firstly, he points out that we are much more confident of the causal efficacy of higher-level events than we are of the soundness of Kim's argument, 'If we begin … with earthquakes, rivers or glaciers, match lightings and other events characterized by macro-properties, Kim's argument seems much less compelling' (p. 82). Kim tries to block the generalising of his argument to all macro-level properties, claiming that his argument does not apply to 'micro-based properties' (P is a micro-based property just in case P is the property of being completely decomposable into non-overlapping proper parts, a1, a2, … an such that P1a1, P2a2, … Pnan, and R(a1, a2, … an)). But, as Noordhof argues, whether or not higher-level properties are micro-based seems irrelevant to whether their efficacy is excluded by causal goings on at the fundamental level: if all work is already done by the micro-level properties themselves, what is there left to be done by the micro-based properties?

If Kim's argument does indeed generalise to all macro-level properties, then we are in trouble. Huge swathes of common sense will be overturned if all higher-level properties are epiphenomenal. There is something to Noordhof's Moorean point here. Arguably, our pre-philosophical justification for believing that strikings of matches cause lightings of matches gives us justification for thinking there must be something wrong with Kim's exclusion worries (so long as we are persuaded that the fundamental level is causally closed). But the work isn't done until we have found out what exactly is wrong with the worry. Merely to give a principle which implies its falsity doesn't cut the mustard. Noordhof says in this context, 'We shouldn't abandon a philosophical strategy, any more than we should abandon the search for a cure of a disease, just because it is difficult.' (p. 84). I agree, but to say that there must be a cure is not to find the cure.

To be fair, Noordhof's long discussion does make some promising gestures towards a cure, for example, refining our understanding of what 'causal completeness' or 'overdetermination' is, but -- at least in this essay -- these remarks are brief and under-developed. Furthermore, given that we can retain our common sense belief in the efficacy of higher-level properties by rejecting both the transmission of causality principle and the causal closure of the physical, Moorean certainty regarding the efficacy of higher-level properties has at best a very limited role in justifying the transmission of causality principle.

Noordhof's second strategy for justifying the transmission of causality principle relies on an extremely interesting observation of what he calls an 'unmotivated asymmetry'. Kim seems happy to think that higher-level properties are constituted by fundamental physical qualities in an unproblematic way. What, then, is the difficulty with holding that higher-level causal relations are constituted by causal relations at a more fundamental level? Perhaps the causal relation which holds between my pain and my desire to escape is constituted of the causal relation between P and P*, allowing both causal stories to co-exist rather than compete.

Whether or not higher-level properties are emergent or not seems relevant here in assessing whether or not this second strategy helps us avoid causal exclusion worries. For the physicalist, even the 'non-reductive physicalist' (by 'non-reductive physicalist' I simply understand a physicalist who does not identify each and every higher-level property with some physical property), the mental facts are nothing over and above the physical facts (at least this is how I understand 'physicalism'). The mental level, wherein reside my pain and my desire to escape, is not an extra layer of being over and above the physical level, wherein reside P and P*; rather these are just two distinct ways of carving up the same facts. Against this background, it does indeed seem an 'unmotivated asymmetry' to deny that causal relations at the mental level (for example, between pain and desire) are nothing over and above the causal relations at the physical level (for example, between P and P*), and this surely entails that these two causal stories are not in competition.

But if my pain is something over and above the physical facts and hence brings into the world genuinely novel causal efficacy (whatever that means: we return to the issue of the first theme discussed above), overdetermination again looms. If P* is caused by P and is sufficient for the existence of my desire, then the metaphysically novel causal efficacy which comes with my pain is redundant so far as the explanation of either P or my desire is concerned; the existence of both has been accounted for by the physical facts.

Returning to O'Connor and Churchill: they build into their definition of a 'causal powers ontology' the commitment to causal relations being ontologically basic. But is this a necessary part of the view? Could we not hold that the nature of a property is characterised causally and yet also hold that some causal powers (mental ones) are nothing over and above other causal powers (physical ones), and hence reconcile the two causal stories? I'm not sure. Our answer to this question may depend on our account of what it is for one fact to be 'nothing over and above' another (and perhaps on our account of what a causal power is), which brings us again back to the first theme discussed above.

We have reached an interesting point. We now have four ways in which Kim-style exclusion worries can be avoided:

1. Being a Humean about causation.

2. Denying that the fundamental level is casually closed.

3. Holding that higher-level properties are causally explanatory, rather than causally efficacious.

4. Holding that higher-level properties are nothing over and above the fundamental facts.

We have found that the Kim-style worries apply only to a very limited class of views: emergentist non-Humeans who hold that the fundamental level is causally closed whilst at the same time holding that emergent higher-level properties are genuinely efficacious. Causal exclusion is not a general concern in the way it has often been taken to be.

Still, it's worth asking: is there any way such a view -- i.e., emergentist non-Humean realism about higher-level causal efficacy in conjunction with a commitment to the causal closure of the fundamental level -- can avoid causal exclusion worries?

I think at this stage a little metaphysical imagination is required. If you put your mind to it, coherent metaphysical hypotheses can be formulated which avoid causal exclusion worries without relying on any of the get-out clauses already discussed. I will now sketch such a view, which I call -- for reasons that should become obvious -- the 'cosmic accordion view'.[2]

It is generally assumed without question that the metaphysically fundamental properties are also the causally efficacious properties. But this can be denied. Suppose that the world is made up of fundamental particles, but that these particles come together to form emergent wholes, by which I mean composite objects whose existence and nature are metaphysically additional to the existence and nature of the particles of which they are composed. We can take it, for the sake of simplicity, that composition is unrestricted: for each set of particles there is an emergent whole composed of the members of that set. It follows that, at any given time, there is an emergent whole composed of all the particles: the whole cosmos is an emergent whole.

But suppose that the only real causal powers are possessed by the cosmos, and that these are causal powers to impact on the fundamental particles of which the cosmos is composed. At T1 the particles are a certain way, in virtue of which they constitute the universe being as it is at T1 (in virtue of constituting the level above, which constitutes the level above, which constitutes the level above, and so on right up to the top). Because of the way the universe is at T1, it causally impacts on the particles, causing them to be a certain (new) way at T2. Because of the way the particles are at T2, they constitute the universe being a certain way at T2 (in virtue of constituting the level above, which constitutes the level above, etc.). Because of the way the universe is at T2, it causally impacts on the particles, causing them to be a certain (new) way at T3. Because of the way the particles are at T3, they constitute the universe being a certain way at T3, and so on ad infinitum.

At each moment, we have chains of dependence running up and down the universe, enfolding each level in a cosmic sweep of change. My pain is involved in a cosmic sweep of making the world different, which ultimately results in my desire to get away (my pain makes the cosmos as a whole a certain way such that it causally affects the particles at the next moment, such that they constitute a world which contains my desire to escape). But P and P* are also involved in this cosmic sweep; no level is redundant.

Does the cosmic accordion view respect causal closure of the fundamental level? Not if we define causal closure of the fundamental level as the view that every event has a cause at the fundamental level, for only the whole cosmos is genuinely causally efficacious. However, it does respect causal closure if we define it as the view that for every event E, there is a fundamental event F, such that F is sufficient for E (sufficient in virtue of constituting the universe such that it causes the particles to constitute a universe containing E). If we have reason to believe that the fundamental level is causally closed, this reason is surely grounded in empirical evidence. But any evidence that can be accounted for by supposing causal closure on the first definition (i.e., every event has a fundamental event which is causally sufficient for it) can also be accounted for by supposing causal closure on the second definition (i.e., any event has a fundamental event which is sufficient for it). The cosmic accordion view respects any kind of empirical evidence that might be thought to count in favour of closure of the fundamental level.

Strictly speaking, of course, the cosmic accordion view does not entail that my pain causes my desire to get away. Nonetheless, it entails that my desire to get away is dependent on my pain, that the fact I desire to get away can be explained in terms of my pain. This is surely all that common sense requires. One might worry that my pain is redundant in the explanation of my desire, given that an earlier event in the cosmic sweep, i.e., the physical event P, is sufficient for my desire. But it is difficult to see why the fact that there are events in the cosmic sweep prior to my pain makes my pain redundant, any more than the fact that there are causes in the history of the universe prior to my pain makes my pain redundant. The cosmic accordion view seems to let us have everything that common sense and the evidence might cause us to desire.


Sider, T. (2001) Four-Dimensionalism, New York: Oxford University Press.

Sider, T. (2009) 'Ontological realism', in Chalmers, D., Manley, D. and Wasserman, R. (2009) (Eds.) Metametaphysics, Clarendon Press: Oxford, 384-423.

[1] In his well-known 2001 book Four-Dimensionalism, Sider claims that the elite quantifier ranges over any mereological sum of entities. Does that make him an emergentist, indeed an emergentist about each and every mereological sum (I am grateful to David Chalmers for raising this issue)? Although it sounds strange to think of the position defended in Four-Dimensionalism (and of course many metaphysicans defend a similar view) as 'emergentist', Sider never claims in the book that composite wholes are 'no addition in being' to their parts, and hence gives the impression that he takes composite wholes to be ontologically additional to their parts (in contrast to Armstrong and Lewis, who are also universalists about composition but explicitly claim that composite objects are 'nothing over and above' their parts'). If emergentism is the view that higher-level entities are something over and above (i.e., not nothing over and above) lower-level entities, then the position defended in Four-Dimensionalism counts as emergentism. Any residual concern here is merely terminological: there are many different ways in which we can define the term 'emergentism', but according to one interesting, useful and broadly understood definition, 'emergentism' is the view that at least some higher-level entities are metaphysically novel relative to, i.e., ontologically additional to, their supervenience base.

[2] I would like to thank Emma Bullock for noticing that my first formulation of the cosmic accordion view was incoherent, and for pointing me in the direction where lay its coherence.