Emerging Trends in Continental Philosophy

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Todd May (ed.), Emerging Trends in Continental Philosophy, 252 pp., vol. 8 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 vols.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (cloth), ISBN 978022670461.

Reviewed by Emanuela Bianchi, New York University


The eighth and final volume of Alan D. Schrift's monumental and immensely valuable series, The History of Continental Philosophy, attempts the almost impossible task of identifying and tracking the current continental philosophy scene, and specifically surveying developments over the last fifteen years. As with any historical project that begins to merge with present-day concerns, what is of lasting or canonical significance is difficult to discern as contours or identifiable movements of wave or backlash have not yet quite emerged. Accordingly, the volume is bound to frustrate any practicing philosopher who will inevitably find glaring lacunae in relation to his or her own partial and particular perspective -- for each of us involved in the philosophical enterprise (and especially the typically engagée continental philosophical enterprise) naturally finds our own areas of concern the most pressing, for why else would we work on them? It is a tricky task, then, to review a book that may in fact be of the greatest value to those approaching the discipline from the outside, whether as students or as scholars in other disciplines, from within continental philosophy. Nonetheless, in its breadth, and in the mostly astute strategies of the authors faced with this almost impossible task, the volume covers a great deal of important ground for anyone who wishes to discern in broad brushstrokes the multiple facets of continental philosophy today.

In its contemporaneity the volume is also explicitly driven by and expresses a certain urgency, a response to and engagement with crucial issues facing us today, encompassing, in Schrift's words, "gender, race, politics, art, the environment, science, citizenship and globalization." (xii) Notably absent are vital contemporary considerations of the body, materiality, queer issues, affect theory, and sexuality, areas in which continental philosophy merges with other theoretical humanities domains such as literary theory, gender and queer theory, cultural studies, and political theory. Further, while the essays explicitly "draw on the resources of the traditions surveyed in the preceding seven volumes," (xii) that is from Kant onwards, there is little sense of the wide range of contemporary continental scholarship engaged in productive and often politicized retrievals of earlier moments of the Western tradition, including ancient, medieval, renaissance, or early modern thinking.

The volume's helpful series and volume introductions serve to set the work in its broader context and to define its purview. The book ends, as do all the volumes of the series, with a finely constructed chronology of relevant philosophical, cultural, and political events from the Renaissance to the present, and a comprehensive bibliography and index. The chapters begin auspiciously with a clear and incisive summary of the oeuvre of Judith Butler by Gayle Salamon, which definitively situates her thought in relation to Beauvoir, Austin, Derrida, Hegel, and Nietzsche. In a volume in which most of the essays survey or "rethink" a region of thought or concern, the pieces dealing with a single author (this one and Bruno Bosteels' on Alain Badiou) stand out. Why Butler, and why, given her manifest canonicity at this point, isn't her thought treated in the previous volume covering the period 1980-1995 instead? One pragmatic answer is that she does appear in Volume 7, but she does so as an author providing a survey, along with Rosi Braidotti, of that very philosophical period in which she first rose to prominence, rather than as the subject of an essay. Another answer is that her thought continues to emerge and evolve, and has not yet been in any way superseded. What is remarkable, however, is that in setting the scene with Butler and her performative account of sex and gender, the volume encourages us to read the thinkers treated in several subsequent essays (Badiou, Jacques Ranciere, and various twentieth-century analytic philosophers) in light of Butlerian performativity. Setting Butler in pole position, it becomes evident that though these other authors are neither actively reading nor responding to her, and their concerns and vocabularies are at significant odds with hers (certainly none of them is dealing with the question of gender), her thinking nonetheless holds a certain definitive sway in our historical moment and so behooves us to take it extremely seriously.

Let me flesh this out by carefully attending to, as Salamon invites us to do, the nature of the performative act. For Butler, performativity means that gender and sex do not persist in the realm of fact, but are remade by us at every moment through a temporalized operation through which what is expected reappears as ground and is consolidated through ritualized repetition. Here the "actor" is as much "acted-upon" by the constraints and channels of his/her corporeal, personal, historical, geographical, social and cultural situation as "acting" to recreate and/or possibly displace the situation. The "voice" in which such performativity takes place is neither simply active nor passive, but receptive-creative, and therefore has the capacity to either reinforce or displace (or both) existing hegemonic gender norms, and to both lay bare and cover over their operation. Butler's performativity thus provides us with a concrete framework to understand the potentially transformative encounter, whether with a personal or transpersonal alterity, that in other vocabularies is understood as the "event," as well as to understand the processes by which certain kinds of being are permitted to appear in given contexts while others fall outside the hegemonic frame of legibility and legitimacy. Seen in this light, Butler's thought both productively informs and tacitly critiques the accounts of Badiou and Rancière given in the following three essays by Gabriel Rockhill, Emily Zakin, and Bosteels. Consider, for example, Rockhill's claims that for Rancière

Art and politics . . . are in fact consanguineous insofar as they are both distributions of the sensible (partages du sensible), that is, ways of organizing the field of sensory experience by determining what is visible and audible, as well as what can be said, thought, made or done (40),

or his description of Badiou's poetic truth procedure as the "nominal trace of the event in the sensible that displaces the parameters of the given aesthetic situation," (34). It is impossible, at least for this reader, not to hear in them a resounding echo of Butler's heterosexual matrix and gender performativity that makes the body, bodily practices, and their signifying capacities central to any account of the event (assiduously ignored by both thinkers) and also -- by the by -- rids it of Badiou's problematic Platonism. It is unclear to what extent this effect is a result of editorial intention, but it certainly highlights the radicality and profundity of Butler's thought, and reveals its significance for the contemporary philosophical landscape far beyond the specific region of gender and sexuality to which it is normally confined.

Rockhill and Bosteels' pieces are both highly informative in their explications of Alain Badiou's rather unwieldy thought. Rockhill contrasts Badiou with Rancière in the sphere of aesthetics. Bosteels givies a lucid account of Badiou's set-theoretical approach to thinking the event, setting it in the context of his oeuvre more generally.

Between these essays is Emily Zakin's curiously anomalous chapter on "Rethinking Marxism." Its structure rests on a questionable and inadequately defended distinction between the social and the political. It suffers from poor editorial oversight: it reiterates the thought of both Badiou and Rancière, albeit here in a political frame, and re-covers ground treated more comprehensively in Volume 7's chapter by Lasse Thomassen on "Radical Democracy." It would have been a great deal more useful if it had included an alternative sampling of strands of contemporary Marxist thinking, including Antonio Negri and the entire Autonomia movement, Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak's resituating of Marxism among feminist, postcolonial and textual politics, postmodern/poststructuralist reappraisals of Marxism by the likes of Fredric Jameson and Ètienne Balibar, Cedric Robinson's Black Marxism, the more recent Deleuzian Marxism of writers like Nicholas Thoburn, the queer Marxism of Kevin Floyd, or the interest in non-dialectical or aleatory materialism growing out of the later Althusser, as expressed for example in the work of Jacques Lezra and Pheng Cheah. More positively, the essay does effectively present the thinking of Slavoj Žižek (though the claim that he functions as a "hinge figure" [63] binding Badiou and Laclau is both provocative and unexplained) as well as that of Giorgio Agamben, whose absence otherwise from the series is another serious omission given his enormous influence over recent political thought.

Next is a rather incongruous essay on the links between Anglo-American philosophy and continental philosophy by John Fennell. His emphasis is on the neo-Kantian character of various twentieth-century analytic thinkers (Quine, Davidson, Sellars), insofar as their projects give some credence to the existence of a normative-rational sphere within the context of a naturalist approach to ontology. First, while Fennell gives an accessible account of the analytic philosophical territory, it is unclear that his chapter represents or refers to any sort of "emerging trend" in continental philosophy. A more timely investigation into links across the analytic-continental divide might have, for example, focused on how contemporary analytic work in philosophy of cognitive science is increasingly incorporating philosophical considerations of embodiment rooted in twentieth-century phenomenology and contemporary feminism. Second, and more substantively (and this point is made abundantly plain by Dorothea Olkowski's subsequent piece on science studies), 'naturalism' conceived as a dedication to a sphere fully determined, in high modern style, by 'laws of nature,' does not represent even a nascent link to contemporary continental thought on the appearance of nature in scientific discourse. Olkowski's essay indeed illuminates this complex territory with care, skillfully navigating the thought of Bruno Latour, Ilya Prigogine, and especially Isabelle Stengers, focusing on their emphasis on the inextricability of the objects of scientific study from the social world inhabited by the scientists, as well as a differential account of scientific knowledge in which desire and jouissance play an irreducible role.

The Deleuzian cast of Olkowski's essay finds a certain philosophical, if not thematic, resonance in the next piece on European citizenship by Braidotti. Braidotti presents an optimistic charter for Europe in which thinkers such as Balibar, Habermas, Derrida, Zygmunt Bauman, Paul Gilroy, and Edouard Glissant are cited to argue that the nation (may) no longer function(s) as determinative for politics or identity, but the European Union itself (through intra- and trans-national processes such as immigration, minoritarian movements, social movements, devolution, and so on) might emerge as a site where difference, mobility, hybridity, and nomadism flourish. While such utopianism is frequently (to this reviewer's mind) philosophically and politically salutary, it also comes across in this instance (and perhaps in any instance of philosophical engagement with Realpolitik) as somewhat naïve. Certainly the events of the 2011 Arab Spring and the border panics they instigated have thrown any post-nationalist fantasy of an open or porous Europe into stark relief, and the pan-European machinations of Frontex as managers of Europe's external borders, along with the fragility of Schengen agreement governing its internal ones, raises anew the specter of "Fortress Europe." Admittedly, with its numerous linguistic, historical, and culturally entrenched communities, it is hard to envision Europe subscribing to a federalist imaginary analogous to that of the United States. But, insofar as Europe emerges as a self-same political, administrative, economic and military force on a global scene in which hegemony is increasingly up for grabs, there is also much to be wary of. This dimension of European citizenship clearly requires a sober critique that remains confined to a small section discussing and summarily dismissing "Euroskeptism" in this otherwise largely celebratory essay.

The remaining chapters -- Eduardo Mendieta on postcolonialism, postorientalism, and postoccidentalism; Jonathan Maskit on the environment; and Todd May on globalization -- mark a welcome shift in the tenor of the volume toward even, clear, digestible surveys on the state of their respective fields. Mendieta provides a beautifully written, intellectually generous and authoritative overview of Edward Said's critique of orientalism, of Spivak's postcolonial thought (with the proviso that the centrality of gender and her debt to Derrida are all but erased), and of Homi Bhabha's introduction of psychoanalytic thinking into the terrain. He then disrupts the east/west axis of this explicitly geographically situated discourse with a consideration of thought arising from the Latin American context, sketching a "postoccidentalist" constellation comprising the work of Enrique Dussel, Fernando Coronil, and Walter Mignolo that productively displaces and critiques the ground of Western philosophical knowledge in such a way that

the layering and interlocking of the politics of knowledge with the politics of reading produce[s] for us a geopolitics of knowledge that is attentive to the locus of enunciation of knowledge and how that claimed knowledge is or is not related to those about whom it speaks and seeks to 'represent.' (170)

The concern with geographical location is also evident in Maskit's summary of contemporary continental engagements with environmental issues, in which genealogies are traced principally from German, American, and French contexts. The presumptively overarching influence, especially in the United States, of Heidegger's critique of the instrumentalization of nature in modernity is both attended to, and then displaced, as Maskit turns to Francophone writers such as Michel Serres, Bruno Latour, Serge Moscovici, and Felix Guattari to help map interrelated ecologies of nature, of society, and of the subject. Unfortunately the potential for politically trenchant alliances between environmentalism and anticapitalist, antiglobalization and feminist social movements is somewhat eclipsed in this focus,and the Western-centric terrain appears limited especially in the wake of Mendieta's piece. The essay ends rather abruptly with a limited gesture toward the politics of slow food.

Any worries about political indolence are displaced, however, by May's final offering on globalization. Of all the phenomena treated in the volume, globalization is perhaps the one in which we are so thoroughly and unprecedentedly immersed that discerning its contours presents an almost insurmountable challenge. May meets this challenge by perceptively dividing thinking on the topic into four categories: critiques of media and electronic interconnectedness; notions of multitude; new conceptions of democracy; and a timely reconsideration of anarchism. By bringing together the very different sorts of concerns raised by Jean Baudrillard, Michel Hardt and Antonio Negri, Paulo Virno, Derrida, Laclau and Mouffe, Paul Virilio, and Judith Butler (whose reappearance at the end of the volume gives it a satisfying kuklos structure), May builds a multifaceted account of the plural phenomena clustered under the sign of globalization, and offers a promising poststructuralist account of anarchism as a political philosophical position capable of sensitive and inclusive resistance to its oppressive tendencies. He writes,

For those involved in what was called the "anti-globalization" movement, which is really a globalized anti-authoritarian and anti-transnational capitalist movement, the idea of equality allows one to link the struggles of the Malaysian sweatshop worker, the indigenous farmer in Chiapas, and the illegal immigrant in California. (207)

Anarchism, of course, resonates not only as a political movement, but, as Reiner Schürmann emphasized, as the absence of archê as principle or of normative hegemony considered more generally: "an-arch-ism."[1] In this light, May's call for a renewed subjectivity in the volume's (and the series') final sentence, invites yet further philosophical reflection on thatarchê that is, in modernity, the subject itself.

[1] Reiner Schürmann, Heidegger on Being and Acting: From Principles to Anarchy, trans. Christine Marie-Gros, (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1987).