Emmanuel Levinas on the Priority of Ethics: Putting Ethics First

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Joshua James Shaw, Emmanuel Levinas on the Priority of Ethics: Putting Ethics First, Cambria Press, 2008, 194pp., $104.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781604975215.

Reviewed by Leslie MacAvoy, East Tennessee State University



In Emmanuel Levinas on the Priority of Ethics: Putting Ethics First, Shaw suggests that Levinas scholarship increasingly has concerned itself with questions of language and epistemology, and consequently has lost sight of what Levinas’s philosophy is really about, namely ethics. Shaw opposes the ‘deconstructionist’ reading, which holds that Levinas cannot provide a normative ethics and can tell us nothing about how we should act. Shaw argues that Levinas’s philosophy does contain a normative dimension since the face-to-face encounter discloses an obligation to care for others, and this, he argues, can ground a normative ethics. He defends this claim by offering a ‘pragmatist’ reading of Levinas, emphasizing the practical normative character of the relation to the other, which Shaw elaborates using ideas from analytic moral philosophy.

The book consists of five substantive chapters framed by a prologue and conclusion. The first chapter addresses the deconstructionist criticism that Levinas lacks a normative ethics and cannot offer substantive ethical advice. Shaw argues that this conclusion is reached on the basis of what he calls the ‘ineffability hypothesis’, according to which the face-to-face encounter reveals to us that the other is ‘ineffable’, or absolutely transcendent. From this, it follows that no standards that would express this transcendence can be produced because to articulate such standards would be to contradict the claim that the other is ineffable. To argue against the deconstructionist view, Shaw argues against the ineffability hypothesis on the grounds that it makes moral responsibility dependent on what is essentially an epistemic claim about the other. But, Shaw argues, Levinas begins with moral responsibility; he does not derive it from any epistemic claim about the other’s ineffability. So, the ineffability hypothesis is wrong.

Shaw acknowledges that Levinas does hold that the other is transcendent, but he denies that this transcendence is in any way derived from a claim about the other’s incomprehensibility. It is instead derived from the disclosure of ethical responsibility in the face-to-face encounter. Shaw pursues this argument in the second chapter through a discussion of what he calls the ‘murder argument’ from Totality and Infinity, referring to the well-known passage in which Levinas claims that murder is impossible. For Shaw, the murder argument is the linchpin of Totality and Infinity, and it establishes two things. First the argument shows that Levinas is a kind of moral realist because we cannot help but recognize the moral value of the other; this is given to us in the face-to-face relation as a kind of moral fact. Second, it provides an alternate interpretation to Levinas’s claims about the incomprehensibility of the other. Since this moral fact is in some sense felt more than it is known, Levinas claims that the other is incomprehensible. For Shaw, this makes clear that Levinas is not saying that the other as such can’t be known. Rather Levinas is saying that the proper relation to the other isn’t a knowing relation, it’s a normative one.

Having dispensed with the ineffability hypothesis, Shaw turns his attention in the three remaining chapters to the question of Levinas’s normative ethics. To support the claim that he can and does tell us something about how we should act, Shaw cites Levinas’s criticisms of anti-humanism and his comments supporting humanist political ideals. While such texts make Levinas sound like a Kantian liberal, Shaw argues that although Levinas espouses humanist liberal values, his concern with ethical particularity precludes this interpretation. In these chapters Shaw also takes up the issue of the relation between the ethical and the political in Levinas. In his view, Levinas scholarship has neglected the issue of how the political, in Levinas’s sense, is informed by the ethical, perhaps in part because of the deconstructionist view that the political cannot be guided by the ethical. Against this and building upon the idea of ethical particularity just noted, Shaw argues that Levinas’s philosophy supplies us with an obligation or duty to care that, contrary to the deconstructionist view, can indeed serve as a guideline for evaluating social, political and legal institutions. Shaw illustrates this point through a discussion of Kittay’s dependency critique of Rawls, in which she objects to Rawls’ theory of justice for failing to be sensitive to the different needs of individuals in a society and to the level of care that they will need. For Shaw, Kittay’s objection uses a Levinasian ethical criterion — the duty to care for the other — in a critique of political theory and institutions, and thus exemplifies what the deconstructionist critique claims isn’t possible within Levinas’s philosophy — an ethical standard for the evaluation of the political.

Shaw accepts that the political may never fully and adequately express this duty, but he is not bothered by this because he is offering a pragmatic reading of Levinas. In the fifth chapter Shaw justifies comparing Levinas with the pragmatists on the grounds that his philosophy shares certain features with pragmatism, specifically the priority of practical consequences over epistemic considerations and a privileging of the point of view of the agent over the ‘spectatorial’ point of view. Nevertheless, Shaw doesn’t want to argue that Levinas is a pragmatist because, while the pragmatists are motivated to take up this position by epistemic concerns, Levinas is motivated by his reflections on moral responsibility. Shaw justifies his pragmatic reading of Levinas on the grounds that it makes better sense of the role that ethics plays in Levinas than the deconstructionist view. If the political can never truly capture the ethical, then all this really means is that any politics or normative ethics can only be provisional. Its provisional status, however, doesn’t prevent it from guiding action.

The book is generally clear and well structured. Shaw avoids excessive use of Levinas’s jargon. In this respect, the book should be accessible to readers who are not already familiar with Levinas’s work. Shaw explicitly aims to connect Levinas with analytic philosophy, which is indeed something that is not frequently done, and some of the connections he makes are interesting and illuminating.

The argument of the book, taken in broad outline, makes sense. It seems obvious that one can extract something of a normative nature from Levinas’s philosophy, and it seems clear that the claim that one can construct nothing at all of this sort is overstated if taken strictly. Shaw also is right that Levinas would probably endorse the broadly humanist ethics/politics that Shaw describes. Levinas himself says in Ethics and Infinity that one could construct an ethics from his philosophy, though he also insists that it is not his concern to do so (90). This comment, or at least the first part of it, would seem to support Shaw in his objection to the deconstructionist position.

Since the polemic against this position dominates the book, this aspect of Shaw’s text merits closer examination. It should be noted that there seem to be two forms of the deconstructionist position under discussion. The first, which I shall call the ‘strong thesis’, holds that Levinas can say nothing at all about normative ethics. The second, which I shall call the ‘weak thesis’, holds that whatever normative ethics one might come up with will betray the ethical. The strong thesis seems overstated and, if taken strictly, false because we could simply cite the distinction between the ethical and the political as a reason for thinking that we can in fact say something normative on Levinas’s own terms. Since the deconstructionist is not in fact ignorant of this distinction, we should, then, be more attentive to what the strong thesis is actually saying. When the deconstructionist claims that Levinas can tell us nothing about how to act, what she means is that Levinas can’t, on his own terms, make any moral pronouncements without betraying the ethical. This is a point about language. Shaw is uninterested in the issue of language, but Levinas himself recognizes the force of this point. The same general idea is behind the weaker deconstructionist claim that the ethical cannot be translated into the political without betraying it. Thus, we can see that closer examination of the strong thesis shows it to be more akin to the weak thesis. In this case, Shaw should focus on the weaker claim, but he spends more of his time arguing against the strong claim, in particular arguing against the ineffability hypothesis, which he believes underlies it.

The details of Shaw’s argument are somewhat troublesome. In explaining the ineffability hypothesis, he says that the deconstructionist holds that there is something ineffable and hence transcendent about the other, and from this it follows that one cannot derive any ethical standards without contradicting this ineffability. Shaw rejects the premise about the ineffability of the other because it is an epistemic claim and, importantly, because he thinks the deconstructionist reading holds that this epistemic claim grounds Levinas’s claims about responsibility. This second element is the focus of Shaw’s objection. Levinas, he argues, doesn’t derive his claims about moral responsibility from epistemological claims about the other; rather, he starts with moral responsibility.

Shaw is right about this; Levinas does start with ethical responsibility, in the sense that it is the ‘phenomenon’ that he takes as primary. But it is not clear why it couldn’t be shown that the claim that the other is ineffable in some way derives from his analysis of responsibility. For Levinas responsibility is experienced in the ethical relation between oneself and a singular other and is always about experiencing oneself being put in check by consideration for somebody else. As such, the very structure of the ethical relation must be asymmetrical, otherwise we could not experience the moral force of ethical obligation toward the other. On Levinas’s account, then, the phenomenon of ethical responsibility necessitates an account of the other as other, and it is presumably this part of Levinas’s text that contributes to the idea that the other is ineffable. Thus, it is not clear that if we begin with moral responsibility (as Shaw rightly insists) that we will avoid the ineffability hypothesis. It could be argued that the hypothesis, in fact, is itself derived from a more basic premise regarding responsibility. Further, it isn’t clear that the deconstructionist reading is based on the ineffability of the other. It might be based more on the slippage that exists between the hyperbolic, infinite character of responsibility and any attempt to cash out that responsibility in terms of normative principles. So it might be the infinite and inexhaustible nature of responsibility that poses the problem, not the ineffability of the other as such. This might yield a different version of the ineffability hypothesis than the one Shaw considers.

It follows that there might be more to the ineffability hypothesis than Shaw thinks. This is further supported by the fact that in Otherwise than Being Levinas himself seems to accept a version of it. In “Violence and Metaphysics” Derrida criticizes Totality and Infinity by claiming that one cannot write about the ethical relation, which is supposed to escape the limits of ontology, without ontologizing it. In Otherwise than Being Levinas grants that this is so. In drawing the distinction between the Saying and the Said, Levinas acknowledges that the Said is always a betrayal of the Saying (cf. 5-7). The Saying, while not the same thing as the other, is nonetheless characterized by Levinas as ethical. So, when Levinas grants that the Saying is always betrayed in the Said, he grants a version of the ineffability hypothesis. Nevertheless, to the extent that he thinks that the move from the Saying to the Said is necessary, and to the extent that he thinks that the moment of Saying might be intimated in the Said, this suggests once again that the strong version of the deconstructionist position is overstated, and that it should be interpreted along the lines of the weak deconstructionist claim. But it is clear that citing evidence from Levinas’s political writings does not suffice against the weak deconstructionist position. Pointing out Levinas’s political or normative ethical views does not disprove the claim that the political betrays the ethical. What Shaw has to show is that there is a way for the political to do justice to the ethical.

The dispute, then, between Shaw and the deconstructionist shifts to the question of whether or not the ethical as Levinas describes it can be translated into the political. Shaw thinks it can; the deconstructionist does not. The deconstructionist does not think the ethical can be translated into the political because she thinks that the political betrays the ethical. She thinks this because the ethical involves a singular responsibility to a singular incomparable other, while the political requires ‘comparing incomparables’ in order to devise general principles for guiding action. Shaw, on the other hand, thinks that his gloss on the ethical as a ‘duty to care’ does justice to what Levinas means by the ethical, and that this, then, amounts to a Levinasian criterion by which we can assess political institutions. The deconstructionist would maintain that such a gloss already translates the ethical in Levinas’s sense into a normative ethical expression, and so already betrays it, failing to capture the infinity and singularity of the responsibility that Levinas expresses with this idea. Shaw’s ‘ethical’ criterion thus would not lie in the ethical after all, but in the political.

In summary, Shaw is right that there are some resources in Levinas for generating a normative ethics and has some interesting ideas for how one might go about doing this. But, to a certain extent, it also seems that Shaw and the deconstructionist are talking past one another, and that the debate remains unresolved. As Shaw points out, the deconstructionist is more worried about the accuracy of the translation of the ethical to the political, while he himself, as a pragmatist, is more concerned with the efficacy of what results from this translation.