Emotion and Cognitive Life in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy

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Lisa Shapiro and Martin Pickavé (eds.), Emotion and Cognitive Life in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 296pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199579914.

Reviewed by Matthew J. Kisner, University of South Carolina


Contemporary philosophers of emotions sometimes complain that the emotions are unfairly maligned or overlooked because of their alleged opposition to reason. According to a familiar story, knowledge and understanding arise from rational mental processes, to which the emotions either do not contribute or, worse, contribute negatively by generating confusion and leading us to mistaken, specious conclusions. Defenders of the emotions often respond to this criticism by showing that the emotions make positive contributions to reasoning and knowledge. Emotion and Cognitive Life in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy explains the historical background to this question by bringing together essays concerning the various ways that historical figures conceived of the emotions' contribution to cognition. This anthology shows that today's defenders of the emotions find themselves in good historical company, as many of these figures regarded the emotions -- passions or affections, to use less anachronistic terms -- as indispensible to cognition. In doing so, the volume not only provides an important contribution to historical scholarship on the emotions, but also maps out some central strategies for understanding the emotions' role in cognition, which is important to philosophy of the emotions today.

The essays can be roughly divided into two categories, those concerned with medieval and those concerned with early modern theories of the emotions, though there is some overlap. Some of the essays, particularly Paul Hoffman's "Reasons, Causes, and Inclinations," compare medieval and early modern theories, while Sabrina Ebbersmeyer's "The Philosopher as a Lover: Renaissance Debates on Platonic Eros," and Simo Knuuttila's "Sixteenth-Century Discussions of the Passions of the Will," examine later figures, such as Giordano Bruno and Francisco Suárez, who lie at the cusp of the early modern period. Consequently, the anthology helps the reader to trace how early modern theories of the emotions emerge from and respond to medieval theories, which is one of the anthology's most valuable contributions to the literature. The medieval essays, such as Knuuttila's, are particularly good at providing broad, systematic overviews, which is helpful to those who are more familiar with early modern accounts of the emotions and want a better sense of their historical context.

The essays on medieval philosophy tend to focus on the question of how philosophers situated the emotions within broader theories of mind, which has important implications for how they contribute to cognition. Taken as a whole, the essays on medieval philosophy present something like the following picture. The highly influential Thomistic view -- a touchstone throughout the essays -- locates the passions within the sensitive, appetitive powers of the soul. According to this view, the passions are non-cognitive movements of the appetite, which possess intentionality because they are caused by or associated with cognitions. According to this picture, the passions are located in the part of the soul that we share with animals, which may be taken to suggest that the passions are divorced from cognitive processes. However, Dominik Perler's essay, "Medieval Debates on Animal Passions," shows that Aquinas followed Avicenna in conceiving of animals as capable of much cognition. Furthermore, Perler shows that, according to Aquinas, the intellectual and sensitive powers of the soul cooperate in human beings so that the cognitive mechanisms in the sensitive soul that underlie the passions are informed by reasoning and intellectual activity.

The essays examine two main ways that this Thomistic view was contested in medieval philosophy. First, some philosophers, particularly John Duns Scotus and William of Ockham, held that there are passions of the will. Since the will was understood as a power of the intellect, this view locates passions in the intellectual, rather than the sensitive powers of the soul. Peter King's essay helps to explain the significance of this commitment. Examining the Stoics, Augustine and ultimately Aquinas, King argues that there was a tradition of admitting a fuzzy category of mental states that resemble passions, but cannot be strictly classified as passions because they do not possess properties essential to them. King calls these "Dispassionate Passions," the paradoxical title of the essay. Augustine and Aquinas admit this category partly because they want to allow for passionate states, such as the joy that souls experience in the afterlife, that do not involve the body, as passions do. By opening up the conceptual space for passions of the will, then, Scotus and Ockham make it possible to regard these states as proper passions. The essay by Ian Drummond examines Scotus's view, explaining how, for Scotus, there can be passions of the will, when they lack the material, bodily element that usually explains how the passions are passive. Claude Panaccio's essay considers Ockham's view on passions of the will, though its main focus is Ockham's distinction between intellectual and volitional acts. Knuuttila's essay complements this discussion by explaining how Scotus's and Ockham's views were received in the sixteenth-century, particularly by John Mair and Francisco Suárez.

Second, in much the same way that Scotus and Ockham challenged whether the passions belong exclusively to the sensitive powers of the soul, other philosophers challenged Aquinas's notion that the passions belong exclusively to the appetitive, rather than the intellectual powers. Martin Pickavé's essay examines this "minority" view, defended by Adam Wodenham. Wodenham understood emotions as cognitions and, thus, belonging to the apprehensive powers of the mind, though he also regarded emotions as acts of appetite. Pickavé argues, against those who tend to read medieval philosophers as cognitivists about the emotions, that this is one of the few places where medieval philosophers took up the question of whether the emotions are cognitive, a common question in contemporary philosophy of the emotions.

While the essays on early modern philosophy tend to be more narrowly focused on issues pertaining to particular philosophers, they provide some indication of how early modern theories of the passions in general are situated with respect to the medieval theories. In particular, Lisa Shapiro, in "How We Experience the World: Passionate Perception in Descartes and Spinoza," shows that Descartes and Spinoza break with the "familiar" view that the passions are motivational, non-intentional states that are brought about by sensations, which provide the passions with intentional objects. In contrast, Shapiro argues that Descartes and Spinoza conceived the passions as themselves containing information and intentional perceptions, rather than as acquiring these from sensations. According to this view, the passions are both perceptual -- in the same way as sensations -- and motivating. Indeed, she claims that these philosophers understood our experiences of the world as possessing a fundamental affective dimension. This reading shows an important way that Descartes and Spinoza break with the dominant medieval view, discussed above, that the passions are purely appetitive and acquire intentionality from their association with other perceptions and cognitions. Furthermore, this reading shows that Descartes and Spinoza are more continuous with contemporary theories of emotions, which tend to regard the emotions as complex states that have both motivational and perceptual elements, as Pickavé argues (p. 96).

Shapiro's claim that Spinoza understands the passions as perceptual sets the stage for Lilli Alanen's, "Spinoza on Passions and Self-Knowledge: the Case of Pride." Alanen examines a problem in Spinoza's philosophy that arises because he conceives of the passions as kinds of perceptions, more specifically, inadequate ideas. Alanen argues that, for Spinoza, the passions of pride and self-esteem are the only basis for perceiving ourselves as individuals. Since these ideas are necessarily inadequate, it is not clear how we can genuinely know ourselves. For us to acquire true knowledge, that is, adequate ideas of ourselves, it seems that we would need to transcend our passions and, in doing so, our only source of knowledge about ourselves as individuals.

Like Shapiro, Paul Hoffman also helps to connect early modern and medieval theories of emotions. While Hoffman's essay focuses on a question raised by Mark Wrathall's work on reasons and motives, Hoffman's consideration of this question leads him to consider Aquinas's, Descartes's and Leibniz's views about how something can incline the will, as passions are often supposed to do. Whereas Shapiro draws our attention to an important break between common medieval theories and early modern philosophers, Hoffman draws attention to a point of continuity. He argues that Descartes and Leibniz agree with Aquinas that the passions incline the will because of their association with representations of good and evil and, thus, by offering reasons, rather than by mechanically causing the will to incline in some direction.

Amy M. Schmitter's, "Family Trees: Sympathy, Comparison, and the Proliferation of the Passions in Hume and his Predecessors," rounds out the volume by explaining what is distinctive about Hume's account of the passions. While Schmitter does not look as far back as medieval philosophy, she does show the ways in which Hume's theory of the passions is novel and innovative given the immediate context of theorizing about the passions in the eighteenth century. Consequently, Schmitter helps to extend the anthology's narrative beyond the seventeenth century, which receives the lion's share of attention in the essays on early modern philosophy.

If I have anything like a criticism, it concerns one way Shapiro and Pickavé explain how the anthology contributes to the literature, a way that features prominently in promotional literature for the anthology. They claim, "historians of philosophy have typically focused on the discussions of the moral relevance of the emotions," without devoting much attention "to the place of emotions in cognition" (p. 2). Without more qualification or explanation, I am inclined to resist this characterization, first, because it does not strike me as entirely true, at least, not of the literature on early modern philosophy. While work on the moral sentimentalists -- Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Hume and Smith -- as well as their interlocutors has focused on examining the emotions in a moral context, this seems less true of work on seventeenth-century philosophy. Susan James' Passion and Action: The Emotions in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, perhaps the most systematic philosophical treatment of emotions during this period, generally steers clear of moral philosophy. Most of the work on Descartes's theory of the passions has focused on its implications for understanding the relationship between the mind and body, while work on Spinoza's theory of emotions has tended to focus on how the passions are situated within his metaphysics.[1] While this work usually has peripheral interest in moral philosophy, it focuses more on how the emotions fit into the philosophers' broader theories of the mind, which is closely connected to understanding how the emotions are related to cognition. It seems that there are many different, localized literatures in the history of emotions, each with its own emphases and lacunae, which makes it difficult to generalize.

There is a second reason to resist Shapiro and Pickavé's claim, one that helps to illustrate something valuable about the anthology. Focusing on the passions' importance to morality, rather than cognition, is potentially problematic not only because it neglects the importance of the passions to cognition, but also because it might imply a false dichotomy, which supposes that research on the emotions must contribute to work on the passions' importance to either morality or cognition. I am reticent to conceive of the anthology as contributing to our understanding of cognition rather than morality because such a conception might perpetuate this dichotomy. My concern arises on the first page of the introduction, where Shapiro and Pickavé assert that historians of philosophy have focused on aspects of the passions relevant to morality because they tend to emphasize the passions' role in motivation, which "discounts the many ways in which emotions figure in our cognitive lives" (p. 1). It is not clear, however, why focusing on the motivational aspects of the passions would lead one to discount their importance to cognition. On the contrary, the essays are particularly interesting because they show that the motivational aspect of the passions, their most morally salient feature, is also critical to understanding their contribution to cognition.

This point is particularly evident in Deborah Brown's "Agency and Attention in Malebranche's Theory of Cognition," which argues that Malebranche conceives the passion of wonder as critical to correcting cognitive errors. Wonder plays this role, Brown argues, because it directs our attention in a way that is impartial, which helps us to achieve a more objective understanding. In this way, the passion of wonder contributes to cognition largely because of its ability to motivate cognitive acts: the voluntary direction of attention and judgments. This is the converse of Hoffman's claim that the passions, for Aquinas, Leibniz and Descartes, influence and direct the will by providing reasons that derive from associated perceptions: whereas Hoffman argues that the passions, for early modern philosophers like Descartes, motivate in virtue of their association with cognitions, Brown argues that, for Malebranche, Descartes and Augustine, the passions contribute to cognition because of their ability to motivate. Brown and Hoffman agree here that the passions' importance to cognition, for many early modern philosophers, cannot be separated from their importance to motivation, a sentiment shared by Shapiro's essay. In this way, the essays suggest that we should avoid thinking of the emotions, for early modern philosophers, as possessing one set of traits that is important to morality and another set that is important to cognition. Consequently, we should also be careful about thinking of the literature on early modern theories of emotions as falling into one category or the other. This point is underscored by the fact that many of the essays take up explicitly moral issues, particularly those of Panaccio, Schmitter, and Dennis Des Chene ("Using the Passions").

In conclusion, this excellent volume provides a valuable overview of medieval debates about how to situate the passions within the mind and the role of the passions in cognition. It also provides some interesting and insightful essays on various subjects pertaining to early modern views on the passions and cognition, which help to show how early modern theories of the passions emerge from this medieval background. It is essential reading for anyone interested in the burgeoning field of work on the history of the passions and for contemporary philosophers interested in the connection between emotions and cognition.

[1] With respect to Descartes, I am thinking of Deborah Brown's Descartes and the Passionate Mind and Lilli Alanen's Descartes's Concept of Mind, each of which contains a chapter on ethics, but otherwise devotes more energy to understanding how the passions inform Descartes's philosophy of mind. With respect to Spinoza, I am thinking of overviews of Spinoza's view of the passions, such as Michael LeBuffe's "The Anatomy of the Passions," in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza's Ethics and Michael Della Rocca's "Spinoza's Metaphysical Psychology," in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza.