Emotion and Value

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Sabine Roeser and Cain Todd (eds.), Emotion and Value, Oxford University Press, 2014, 258pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199686094.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Seidman, Vassar College


When one hears hooves thundering one's way on the streets of Pamplona, fear is fitting and its absence unfitting, because the approaching bull is dangerous. Dangerousness is an evaluative property. Fear and dangerousness -- and more generally, emotion and value -- thus seem to be intimately tied up with one another. While the fact of this relation is common ground for most of this volume's fifteen chapters its nature and implications are not. Some of the chapters lean on this relation to try to shed light on at least one of the relata: on the nature of the emotions (Michelle Montague, Sabine Döring, Greg Currie, Julien Deonna and Fabrice Teroni, Jonathan Dancy), on the nature of value (Michael Brady, Cain Todd), or both (Jan Slaby and Philipp Wüschner). Some defend claims about the epistemic role of emotions in justifying beliefs about value (Adam Pelser, Linda Zagzebski). And some respond to ways in which emotional phenomena can distort a subject's evaluative perspective (Nancy Sherman, Michael Lacewing, Matthew Ratcliffe).

The essays,helpfully introduced by Sabine Roeser and Cain Todd, are drawn from three conferences, all in May 2011. It is evident that the papers selected were among the best, and the result is that one may approach the volume as one would approach an unusually good conference -- with confidence that every paper will be worth one's time and that a few will be real gems. As at a good conference, one may either dip in according to one's interests, or read straight through in order to assemble a helpful snap-shot of the current state of (much of) the field. This latter approach is made easier by the fact that the chapters are all pleasantly concise -- averaging about fifteen pages apiece.

The nature of emotion

The observation that different evaluative properties constitute fittingness or appropriateness conditions for different types of emotion gives rise naturally to the idea that emotions are evaluative attitudes: in fearing the bull, one evaluates it as dangerous. This is something close to a commonplace in the philosophy of emotion. The question is how to unpack it. Robert Solomon (1988) and Martha Nussbaum (1994) did much to revive the ancient idea that emotions are or essentially involve judgments about the instantiation of evaluative properties (e.g., the judgment that the bull is dangerous). But as the difficulties for this proposal have mounted, an alternative view has become popular: emotions are "perceptions" of value. This perceptual model is actively defended in only one of the chapters (Döring's), but the majority of contributions explicitly or implicitly presuppose it.

Bennett Helm (2001) has objected against the perceptual model that while recalcitrant perceptions (the stick in water looking bent) are not irrational, recalcitrant emotions (the phobic's fear of spiders) can be. Sabine Döring's chapter defends the perceptual model by claiming that while recalcitrant emotions can be in both cognitive and practical conflict with judgments (thus explaining our inclination to call them irrational), the subject who holds them does not contradict herself (any more than someone who sees a stick as bent contradicts herself when she judges it to be straight), and so is not irrational after all. The argument rests on the premise that contradiction is the only criterion of irrationality. Against this, one might suppose that, even without self-contradiction, someone might exhibit irrationality in failing to draw obvious inductive inferences from available evidence, or more generally by failing to respond appropriately to practical or epistemic reasons (Raz (2011), Kolodny (2008)) -- or to reasons to feel or not feel some emotion.

Michelle Montague offers an alternative theory of emotions. On her view, emotions are distinguished from both judgments and ordinary perceptions by the sui generis, essentially evaluative, phenomenology with which they represent objects and states of affairs. Emotions represent things "in an evaluative way" (40), and it is in virtue of our awareness of experiencing things in this way that we attribute evaluative properties to objects.

The chapter by Julien Deonna and Fabrice Teroni (which offers a highly compressed version of the "Attitudinal Theory" of emotions developed in their (2012)) illuminates an important way in which Montague's theory is continuous with, and belongs in the same genus as, the judgmentalist and perceptual theories from which it departs -- a genus we might term "representationalist" theories of emotion. On all three of these theories, the idea that emotions constitute evaluations is spelled out by saying that emotions in some way represent their objects as having evaluative properties. And on each of these theories, different types of emotion (e.g., fear, amusement, anger) are distinguished from one another by their representational content (e.g., by whether they represent their object as dangerous, or amusing, or offensive). On each view, moreover, all of these emotion-types involve a single kind of representing attitude (whether judgment, or perception, or something else) toward the distinctive contents by which the different emotion types are individuated.

Deonna and Teroni offer a theory that does not belong to this genus, according to which the difference between emotion types is a difference in attitude, rather than merely a difference in representated content. On their Attitudinal Theory, when one fears the bull, one assumes a (bodily) attitude toward the bull (involving for instance, a readiness to flee), and this attitude is different from the attitude one takes toward it when one is amused by it. These bodily attitudes are evaluative, not in virtue of having an evaluation as part of their content (they do not), but rather because, in the Scholastic language that Kenny (1963) imported into current discussion, evaluative properties constitute the "formal objects" of these attitudes, and hence contribute to their fittingness or appropriateness conditions. Just as belief is distinguished from supposition by the different formal objects (truth, possibility) that make these two attitudes appropriate, fear is distinguished from amusement by the different formal objects (dangerousness, funniness) that make these attitudes appropriate. And just as a subject can believe some content without so much as possessing the concept of truth (and so without truth being part of the content believed), so a subject can fear something without possessing the concept of dangerousness (and so without dangerousness belonging to the content of the attitude).

In "Emotions Fit for Fiction," Greg Currie presupposes a representationalist view of emotion; but his conclusions actually seem to militate for the Attitudinal Theory. Currie argues that, in admiring his friend, he represents his friend as admirable. One might suppose, by contrast, that in admiring Sherlock Holmes, he represents him as represented as admirable in the stories of Doyle. But Currie argues that this is mistaken: when he admires Holmes, he simply represents Holmes as admirable. The fact that Holmes is a fictional character represented by Doyle is no part of the representational content of his emotion. What distinguishes admiration for a real and for a fictional character is not any structural dissimilarity in their representational content, but rather a dissimilarity in their appropriateness conditions. Admiration of his friend is appropriate only if his friend is admirable, whereas admiration of Holmes is appropriate only if Holmes is represented as admirable. Because admiration of a real character and admiration of a fictional character have different appropriateness conditions, Currie concludes that these are different emotion types. These are, of course, exactly the grounds on which the Attitudinal Theory distinguishes emotion types. Currie's view differs only in presuming that an evaluative property such as admirability must figure not only in the appropriateness conditions of an emotion, but also in its representational content.

In "Emotions as Unitary States," Jonathan Dancy notes that, on most contemporary views, emotions have different "parts" or "aspects:" belief, feeling, motivation, etc. Dancy asks what, if anything, connects these parts in a given emotion, so that they constitute a unitary mental state. (The Attitudinal Theory faces a version of the same worry: what connects the racing heart, the tensed muscles, the watchful attention, and so on into a single bodily attitude, fear?) Dancy's conclusion, like Currie's, jibes nicely with and complements Deonna and Teroni's view. The various "parts" of an emotion are connected, on Dancy's view, insofar as the very same consideration (e.g., that the bull is dangerous) provides a reason for each of them, rendering each of them appropriate.

The nature of value

According to an ambitious family of theories in contemporary metaethics, evaluative properties are response-dependent, and so values are partly constituted by emotions or emotional disposition (McDowell (1984), Wiggins (1987), McNaughton (1988), D'Arms and Jacobsen (2000), Helm (2001)). The title of this volume might lead a reader to expect such views to be widely canvassed within. In fact, only three essays deal directly with the nature of intrinsic value.

Cain Todd argues that sentimentalist views, such as that of D'Arms and Jacobsen, cannot provide for the existence of objective values. Because evaluative concepts are essentially contestable, the fittingness conditions for emotions are ineliminably relative to the motivations, interests, beliefs, goals, values, and so on of subjects or groups of subjects.

Michael Brady considers empirical research showing that subjects feeling positive moods or emotions have a global, rather than local, bias in their attentional focus; and he suggests that this seems to count against the idea that positive emotions play an important role in the epistemology of value. Brady shows that, upon a closer examination of the evidence, this apparent challenge is a red herring. The interest of the article, however, lies in the further claim that the evidence concerning attention can be marshaled into an argument for Robert Nozick's (1981) view of intrinsic value as degree of organic unity. Generalizing the perceptual model of emotions to moods, Brady claims that an agent in a good mood sees the world as good. Substituting in Nozick's analysis of value, this means that she sees the world as a place where "diverse elements are unified and integrated" (68). And this, Brady claims, explains the global bias in attention that such a subject exhibits.

Jan Slaby and Philipp Wüschner note that work in the philosophy of emotions over the last few decades has emphasized, and sought to reconcile, the cognitive and experiential dimensions of emotion. In both of these aspects, emotion appears to be a subject's passive response to her environment. Against this, Slaby and Wüschner argue that emotions are "forms of active comportment in and towards the world" (215), and that, temporally extended, intentional activity is thus inseparable from, and helps to explain, the cognition and experience that constitute emotion. This claim is relatively clear, and certainly interesting. No less interesting, but somewhat less clear, is their claim that "emotional engagement is what lets value manifest itself and become concrete, in that it opens up a practical sphere rife and buzzing with what ought to be (or not be)" (212). The authors mean thereby to suggest, in a spirit something like that the of sentimentalists and also of Helm (2001), that emotions are at once constituted by and constitutive of the values to which they are connected. The chapter draws throughout on ideas from the Continental tradition, and like the best work in that tradition, it reveals ways in which descriptions of the phenomena that are often taken for granted may be inadequate and overly-reductive. And like much work in that tradition, its positive suggestions at times have an elusive quality: they are tantalizing, but harder to catch firm hold of than one would wish.

The epistemic role of emotion

Adam C. Pelser notes that emotional experience often gives rise, non-inferentially, to evaluative belief: my amusement at the joke leads me to believe that it is funny. Pelser argues, against several objections, that such transitions can be justified -- indeed, that emotions are a foundational source of epistemic justification, without which we might not even form some evaluative concepts, let alone employ them successfully in evaluative judgments. His argument rests on the perceptual model of emotion: in being amused by the joke, I directly experience its funniness. If I am incapable of such amusement, I may still believe (say, on the basis of testimony) that a joke is funny, but my epistemic relation to funniness is like Mary's epistemic relation to color in Jackson (1982).

In "Emotional Self-Trust," Linda Zagzebski's question is not, at first glance, about the epistemological role of emotions in justifying beliefs, but rather about whether our emotions are themselves justified. Zagzebski draws on arguments from her (2012) that justification of our (non-emotional) epistemic capacities is necessarily circular (because it must rely on the very capacities it seeks to justify), and that a rational response to this circularity is to begin from a stance of self-trust toward our epistemic capacities, which accords their deliverances a default status as presumptively legitimate, and to supplement this self-trust with an attitude of "epistemic conscientiousness" that aims, reflectively, to correct for possible epistemic failures. In this chapter, she argues that the justification of emotional dispositions is similarly circular (she thinks that it is not the very same circle, however, because the contents of emotions are not beliefs), and that this fact warrants an analogous attitude of emotional self-trust, supplemented by an analogous "emotional conscientiousness" that aims, through reflection, to correct for possible sources of error, in order to ensure that our emotions fit their objects. Because Zagzebski thinks that emotions are made fitting by the evaluative properties of which they are perceptions, her argument for the justifiability of emotions is, at the same time, an argument for the justifiability of beliefs about the evaluative properties that render emotions fitting. Indeed, such beliefs must figure in the reflective work of emotional conscientiousness at the center of her account.

Adam Morton's opening question is a specific form of Zagzebski's more general question about the rationality of emotions: he asks, in particular, how surprise in the face of unlikely events can be rational -- given that it is entirely predictable that unlikely things will tend to occur. He answers by characterizing surprise as the emotion that prompts inquiry and asks for explanations, and showing how very useful this way of responding to one's environment can be. Surprise can be useful, moreover, even when it rests upon or constitutes a distorted view of one's environment: depending on one's intellectual and emotional constitution, thinking of one's own death as very unlikely, so that one is surprised when it becomes imminent, may make one's life go better. Thus whereas most of the contributors presuppose that there are objective conditions of fittingness for emotion, Morton agrees with Todd in treating the fittingness of an emotion as relative to a subject and her constitution.

Responding to evaluative distortion

The chapters by Nancy Sherman and Michael Lacewing deal with ways in which our emotions may distort our evaluative perspective, and each describes ways in which these distortions, and the ill-fitting emotions that give rise to them, may be combatted. These chapters may be thought of as specifying, in psychologically real and psychoanalytically informed detail, what aspects of the "emotional conscientiousness" that Zagzebski prescribes must actually look like. Partly in virtue of their close-to-the ground, empirically-informed specificity, these are stand-out chapters in the collection.

Lacewing argues that our emotions are often not transparent to us, and that the wish to avoid the psychological pain involved in emotions such as anxiety, fear, guilt, shame, and envy can give rise to unconsciously operating defense mechanisms, which distort our understanding of our own and others' emotions and motivations, and of the world around us -- including its evaluative properties and the moral demands they make on us. In an interpersonal relationship, love from another party can help to remove the impetus to defense, by showing that one's emotions do not make one unlovable. And so it can nurture two dispositions in the subject herself that straddle the boarder between ethical and intellectual virtues, both of which are necessary for the deconstruction of defense mechanisms: courage to accept the emotions against which one wishes to defend, along with their pain, and compassion for oneself, which diminishes that pain by preserving "a sense of self-worth in the midst of emotions that challenge that sense" (208).

Sherman tries to make theoretical sense of an attitude she calls "self-empathy," and of the way in which it can help subjects -- in her examples, soldiers -- who experience guilt in response to good or bad moral luck. Their guilt can be morally admirable, because it is a way of taking responsibility, and yet it can be ill-fitting, because they are not culpable for the events about which they feel guilty. Their guilt thus constitutes a distorted assessment of their own goodness. Self-empathy, as she develops the notion, is not mere kindness or compassion toward oneself. Rather, it involves taking a perspective from outside oneself, so that one is able to "reconstrue (and accept) the limits of [one's] agency" (194) in a way that allows one to see that compassion toward oneself is fitting.

The final chapter, by Mathew Ratcliffe, shares the near-to-the-ground, psychoanalytically-informed specificity of the chapters by Lacewing and Sherman; and like those chapters, it is a highlight of the volume. Also like those chapters, it discusses a particular emotional phenomenon, existential despair, which seems to obscure or distort the perception of value (in this case globally, rather than merely locally). Although this chapter does not take as its explicit themes the more general questions about the relation of emotion and value that run through the volume, it addresses them obliquely, and does as much as any chapter to shed fresh light on them.

The existential despair that Ratcliffe takes as his topic presents itself as a response to heightened awareness of one's own mortality, and manifests itself in a deadening of affective dispositions and an accompanying view of the world as barren of value -- as a place where nothing matters. Ratcliffe's aim is not, as Lacewing's and Sherman's aims are, to show how this malady might be mitigated or coped with. His question is a purely intellectual one, addressed to those of us who do not suffer from existential despair: on what grounds might we justifiedly think of existential despair as an epistemic failure -- as a blockage of our capacities to experience the value in the world -- rather than, as it appears to the person who suffers from it, as the revelation of a terrible and inescapable truth, which our ordinary emotional dispositions obscure and from which our ordinary activities distract us? Where most to the contributors to this volume take emotions to reveal (possibly response-dependent) evaluative properties of things in the world, the subject in existential despair thinks that the fact of mortality means that those properties cannot be what they seem to be, and cannot give us the reasons to engage and act that they seem to give us.

Ratcliffe considers and rejects several arguments that aim to undermine the apparent epistemic symmetry between the positions of a sufferer of despair and our own. He concludes by shifting the burden of proof -- in effect asking why we should take our mortality to render the ordinary activities of life pointless. One way of understanding and answering the question rests upon a highly individualistic conception of one's own life and projects: since I will die, why do my projects matter? Ratcliffe points out that sufferers from despair are in fact often lonely, self-absorbed, and cut-off from others in a way that makes this construal of the question, and the attendant difficulty in answering it, intelligible. But in the context of more ordinarily inter-personal cares and commitments that sustain our emotional dispositions, it is far less clear why my own death should undermine the point of all my activities or the value that I find in the world.

Roeser and Todd have done a service to the discipline by assembling this volume. For those who do not work in the philosophy of the emotions, its contributions will illuminate both the inherent interest of the subject, and its manifold connections to other parts of philosophy. For those seeking to orient themselves in this part of philosophy, it will serve as a helpful survey of significant portions of the terrain. And for those already working in the area, its individual contributions will nourish thought and reward study.


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