Emotion, Reason, and Action in Kant

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Maria Borges, Emotion, Reason, and Action in Kant, Bloomsbury, 2019, 209pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350078369.

Reviewed by Melissa Merritt, University of New South Wales


According to a well-worn caricature, Immanuel Kant took the business of morality to be a matter for the pure rational will, and consequently did not accord much room for emotion in a morally good life. The caricature, of course, does not rule out the possibility of a place for emotion in the parts of human life that might be thought to fall outside the immediate scope of morality. Indeed, when we look to Kant's treatment of some of these other dimensions of human life -- such as his view of aesthetic judgment, and his pioneering work in anthropology -- we find he has a considerable amount to say about the wide range of human emotion. Moreover, when we give Kant's later works in moral philosophy their due, we are much less likely to think of Kantian ethics as a cold and bloodless affair. Maria Borges's book belongs to a tradition of Kant scholarship that eschews the well-worn caricature -- aiming to do so by drawing attention to the wide-ranging significance of emotion in Kant's philosophy.

Kant does not have a single genus term for "emotion". Rather, he invokes a dizzying array of terms for mental states that might -- arguably -- be thought of as varieties of "emotion". He speaks of affects (Affekten) and passions (Leidenschaften), inclination (Neigung) and desire (Begierde), feeling (Gefühl) of various kinds, including several modes of moral feeling; he devoted half of a Critique to the particular ways in which we enjoy beauty and sublimity; he has interesting things to say about epistemic feelings, like admiration or wonderment (Bewunderung) and astonishment (Verwunderung) and the pleasures of comprehension; he ponders the disorienting effects of anger, and the soul-sapping forces of hatred and ambition. But do these mental states share something in virtue of which they can all be thought of as modes of human emotion? Surprisingly, Borges does not consider this question, although she acknowledges a few times that Kant does not -- at least not obviously -- have a term for "emotion" at all. (The term Rührung, perhaps most naturally rendered "emotion" in English, is narrowly associated with the feeling for the sublime in Kant's account.)

It seems there are two appropriate responses to such a fact. One is to provide a reconstructive account of what an emotion is for Kant, arguing for a principled way in which this diverse body of mental states can be unified; such an approach is probably better suited to bring Kant into dialogue with contemporary work on the nature of emotion (see Cohen 2019 for a compelling recent example). Another is to eschew talk of "emotion" altogether in interpreting Kant, recognising that there is a diversity of mental states not readily conceived as instances of a single kind (see, e.g., Frierson 2014).

Borges does not take either approach in a resolute way. However, it seems that a principled account of what an emotion is for Kant would be a necessary condition of meeting her stated aim, to explain the "the real importance of emotion for Kant" (1). Borges instead canvasses Kant's treatment of the range of mental states that we may be liable to think of as "emotions". While she acknowledges some of the key taxonomic differences among these mental states -- for example that "affect" is an expression of the faculty of feeling, but "passion" an expression of the faculty of desire -- she pays relatively little attention to the implication of such classifications, and happily speaks of both as "emotions". At times, she is either careless or extremely casual in her usage of Kant's terminology -- for example, referring to "affects" as a kind of "inclination" (81, 88), when Kant very consistently explains inclination as "habitual desire" (Anthropology 7:251, 265; Metaphysics of Morals 6:212; Religion 6:28).[1] Affects and inclinations, in other words, have different locations in Kant's faculty psychology (for which see Critique of Judgment 5:196-8). The interpretive problem is then to sort out the implications of this division for the case at hand. While some loose talk of "emotion" could be allowed on the grounds that it provides a point of entry for contemporary readers who do not speak Kant's eighteenth-century German, his terminological distinctions should have been more scrupulously observed in the actual interpretations of the text, and their philosophical implications given more focused attention.

Moreover, any account that aims to explain "the real importance of emotion for Kant" will need a unifying principle of some kind, something in relation to which this importance is to be assessed. The layout of the book -- with an initial chapter on rational agency, followed by chapters on various aspects of "the emotions" -- suggests that the aim is to consider the significance of Kant's remarks on emotion for his view of rational agency. However, the first chapter is not tightly integrated into the rest of the book, leaving the particular question of significance unfocused. The main thesis of the first chapter is that the phenomenon of weakness of will reveals that the domain of voluntary actions is wider than the domain of rational actions (17). For Borges, a "rational" action is "maxim-based": she takes this to mean that such an action is one that you decided to do (16). A weak-willed action on this account is voluntary, but not rational: it is performed voluntarily, accountably, but alas it is not what you decided to do.

However, it is not obvious that Kant understands acting on maxims in this way. His emphasis on the difficulty of even identifying what our maxims are (see e.g., Religion 6:20) suggests that our actions express commitment to maxims in a manner that may be independent of overt deliberation or "deciding" what to do. Likewise, the upshot of Kant's conception of apperception, the self-consciousness internal to rational thought as such, for action generally is plausibly that we act on maxims whenever we act intentionally at all, regardless of how thoughtful or reflective we might be (or not) about what those maxims are (see, e.g., Korsgaard, 2009). Commitment to maxims is, at least plausibly, the basis of rational agency according to Kant; such commitment is not necessarily (and perhaps not even typically) the result of overt deliberation or deciding what to do. Of course, the Kantian conception of rationality remains open to debate, and this is not to say that Borges ought to have taken this or that position on it. It is to say, however, that her aim to explain "the real importance of emotion for Kant" might have gained a more determinate point of reference if her leading chapter had tackled such systematic questions.

As it stands, the initial chapter on rational agency intervenes in the work of the ensuing chapters on the emotions mostly in the form of questions about whether we are responsible for our emotions, and the extent to which we can control them. Borges ultimately proposes that the variety of mental states that we might call "emotions" exist on "a continuum ranging from reactive phenomena to the active phenomena of the self" (99, see also 114). She takes this continuum to track the degree to which the subject is responsible for having these mental states, as well as (and this is not clearly distinguished) the degree to which these mental states can be controlled. It is never made fully clear how this continuum links back to the initial thesis about voluntary as opposed to properly "rational" action. Leaving that question aside, our responsibility for such mental states seems, prima facie, to be quite different from the possibility of our controlling them. One way for a Kantian to think about our responsibility for "emotions" is in terms of the question of whether they express commitment to maxims. Such responsibility can be quite independent of the prospects of controlling these mental states, particularly if habit plays a significant role in our being subject to them.

This appears to be the case for Kant's view of "passions", which are a species of "inclination" -- thus a kind of "habitual desire" as Kant consistently glosses that term. Specifically, Kant says that passions "always presuppos[e] a maxim" (Anthropology 7:266). And since Kant takes passions to be "without exception evil [böse]" (Anthropology 7:267), they must -- simply as such -- involve evaluative commitments that are in some way mistaken or misguided. Thus a passion is the expression of rational mindedness, though not in a sound or healthy form. Let us take the particular case of the passion of ambition (see Anthropology 7:266). A passionately ambitious person has a long history of viewing circumstances in light of a deeply embedded commitment to the value of receiving tokens of honour from others. In that sense, the passionate person is responsible for having the passion, since he himself has done what it took to entrench this way of thinking, repeatedly assenting to a particular evaluative outlook; but given this past history, he may not have much immediate control over how it leads him to notice certain things and feel certain ways, even if he comes to express disavowal of the maxim in question. By contrast, Kant takes "affects" to be sudden feelings that suspend the capacity for practical reflection, seizing our agency rather than being a manifestation of it (see especially Kant's account of the distinction in the Metaphysics of Morals, 6:407-8).

Borges places affect somewhere on the "less controllable" end of the continuum, explaining them as a "kind of feeling that cannot be directly controlled by the will" (94). She elaborates the point as follows:

We can decide whether or not to perform a correct action, and hence whether we will feel moral pleasure or displeasure resulting from such an action. But we cannot decide whether it is appropriate to feel anger in a particular situation. (94)

The first sentence implicitly concerns Kant's view of moral self-contentment (Selbstzufriedenheit), the being-pleased at having acted well. Such a feeling, Borges suggests, belongs somewhere on the other, "controllable", end of the continuum: since the correct action is the result of choice, she reasons, the ensuing moral feeling of contentment must be as well, and in that sense "directly controlled by the will". But this first claim cannot be entirely correct. At any rate, it overlooks something that is commonly held to be central to the phenomenology of emotions: namely, that they assail us, come over us. It may be that there is a lot of deliberate doing (and a long past history of such doings) that makes feeling a certain way possible; but in the moment, the feeling at least seems to come over us unbidden. Thus a person might "decide to perform a morally correct action" and carry it out; but her motivational economy may nevertheless fail to support the being-pleased by such a performance. To elaborate the point, Borges would need to say much more than she does about what she takes to be involved in "deciding to perform a morally correct action". The second sentence appears to be more obviously false. For surely what we stand to deliberate or "decide" about in this arena is the appropriateness of a given feeling in a certain situation. It is another question whether our actual feelings are in fact appropriate. What we arguably cannot decide is simply our feeling a given way at all -- and such a point seems to hold for more than just what Kant thinks of as "affect".

In developing the idea that the continuum tracks the degree of control we have over various kinds of "emotion", Borges suggests that various emotion-states involve "physiological arousal" (98) in different ways. The point of this proposal, I take it, is to postulate a component of emotion over which we do not obviously have much or any direct control -- blushing, for example. The greater the significance of such a physiological component in a given emotion, then the further the emotion will be on the one end of the continuum. She presents this line of thought as a critique of Aristotelian readings of Kant (105), and in the course of developing it she provides some useful background about seventeenth-century physiological debates between "mechanists" and "animists" that evidently inform Kant's account of affect in the Anthropology. However, it also leads her into uncertain territory about the Stoic view of the emotions. Throughout these chapters (5 and 6), she maddeningly switches between reference to the "stoic" and the "Stoic" view of the emotions -- leaving it unclear whether she means for these remarks to have any scholarly import at all. For example, she claims that "Kant distinguishes himself from the stoic hostility to all inclinations" (120). For a remark like this to pull any weight, it would need to be backed up by both a clear account of what Kant takes "inclination" to be, as well as an account of what its plausible analogue in Stoicism is (hormē?), neither of which is forthcoming.

Similarly, she sets her "physiological" account of the emotions, which she attributes to Kant, against the "voluntaristic approach found in Aristotle and the Stoics", claiming that a predecessor for her physiological alternative can be found in Galen, whom she claims had a physiological model of the emotions rooted in an analogy with "a downhill runner carried away by his own moment and unable to stop at will" (122). But when Galen says this -- and she does not provide the citation, which is On the Doctrines of Hippocrates and Plato (4.2.16) -- he is not speaking in his own voice at all, but quoting Chrysippus in the course of his relentless polemic against Stoic psychology. This is simply one example of the lack of scholarly care that mars this book. At any rate, far more would need to be said (a) to establish that Galen indeed had a "physiological" model of the emotions, (b) what exactly this means, and (c) why, and on what basis, we should suppose that Galen provides an appropriate guide to Kant's own account. This is not to say that a case could not be made for such claims; but it is to say that the case is not made in this book.

In sum, this book raises important questions about what Kant's view of "the emotions" really is, and what sort of significance emotions might have in a Kantian account of rational agency. However, it neither develops the level of sustained philosophical argument, nor takes the appropriate care with scholarship, that is required to answer these questions in a satisfying way.


Cohen, A. 2019. "A Kantian Account of Emotions as Feelings". Mind (print version forthcoming).

Frierson, P. 2014. "Affective Normativity". In A. Cohen (ed.), Kant on Emotion and Value. Palgrave. pp. 166-190.

Galen. 1981. On the Doctrines of Hippocrates and Plato, ed. Phillip de Lacy. Akademie Verlag, Berlin.

Kant, I. 1996. Practical Philosophy, ed. Mary Gregor. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.

Kant, I. 2000. Critique of the Power of Judgment, ed. Paul Guyer. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.

Kant, I. 2007. Anthropology, History, and Education, ed. Günter Zöller and Robert Louden. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.

Korsgaard, C. 2009. Self-Constitution: Agency, Identity, Integrity. Oxford University Press, New York.

[1] References to Kant's works follow volume and page of the Academy edition: Kants Gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Berlin (and predecessors), 29 vols (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1900-). Quotations follow those in the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant volumes cited below.