Emotional Insight: The Epistemic Role of Emotional Experience

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Michael S. Brady, Emotional Insight: The Epistemic Role of Emotional Experience, Oxford University Press, 2013, 204pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199685523.

Reviewed by John M. Monteleone, Hobart and William Smith Colleges


Many suppose there to be a tension between having or feeling emotions, on the one hand, and cognitive success, on the other. However, the dominant trend in theorizing about emotions has turned quite against this intuition. What has emerged is what Karen Jones calls a "pro-emotion consensus," according to which emotions make essential and positive contributions to our cognitive success.[1] Michael Brady's book is a welcome contribution to the pro-emotion consensus. The book focuses on how exactly emotions contribute to our cognitive success, and therefore, what precisely is the positive epistemic value of emotions. It develops a thorough and fair criticism of what has seemed to be the dominant account, which models emotion on perception (hereafter, the "Perceptual Model.") The book also provides an alternative account of the epistemic role of emotion.

On the Perceptual Model, the person who has the experience of emotion inhabits a state of mind akin to a perceptual experience of value. Brady distinguishes two versions of this claim: the literal theory, on which emotions genuinely constitute perceptual experiences of value, or the non-literal theory, on which perception remains an analogy. While Brady argues in favor of the non-literal version, what is shared by the two theories is even more important. Specifically, these theories both claim that the experience of an emotion is an epistemic reason, although one that can be overridden in various circumstances, for the corresponding evaluative belief. The epistemic role of emotion is thus supposed to be exactly that of perception: hearing a sound as a B-flat is a reason, if my hearing is not damaged, the environment is normal, the source is not moving, etc., to believe that a B-flat is being played. By the same token, experiencing fear is thought to be a defeasible reason to believe that the object is dangerous, experiencing pride a defeasible reason to believe that something is a worthwhile achievement, and so on.

It is precisely this shared commitment that Brady rejects. His argument is based on a novel, important, and compelling account of the nature of emotion. Brady conceives of emotion as a temporally extended process involving attention. At the outset of this process is an initial evaluative appraisal, e.g., in terms of the intentional object as dangerous, a disrespectful action, a worthwhile achievement, etc. According to Brady, these initial appraisals are relatively indiscriminate, since they are due to mechanisms that have evolved to produce fast, automatic responses to a small range of objects. For example, when one is afraid or angry, one's attention will quickly and without deliberation be re-oriented onto the potential danger, in order to ready oneself to fight or flee. However, the second stage of the process is where, as Brady memorably puts it, emotions "capture and consume" attention (92). He says that "emotions such as fear and anger stay with us; they are not simply short term reflexive interruptions to our mental lives, but often persist and dominate that life so that we remain focused on and attentive to danger, infidelity, and slights" (92). While the point of the first stage is to prime us for a quick behavioral response, the point of the second stage is to promote further reflection which improves and corrects the initial, indiscriminate appraisal of the situation.

The view of emotions as capturing and consuming attention speaks against the Perceptual Model. Importantly, according to Brady, people do not treat the mere experience of fear, anger, jealousy, joy, etc., as reasons to form the corresponding evaluative beliefs. In normal conditions, they will not infer from their experience of fear to the fact that they are in danger. That is because, as Brady puts it, "we feel the need for justification [and] . . . seek out facts or considerations which bear on the correctness of our emotional response" (87). Furthermore, the need to discover whether our emotional take on a situation is correct is not incidental to the emotion, but is a direct result of the fact that emotions capture and consume attention (97). In other words, it is part of the very nature of emotion to motivate a slower, more careful reflection on the object and whether that object is really as the emotion presents it. Sometimes this search will uncover considerations that support the initial appraisal and the corresponding evaluative belief, as when a person's terror towards a lion leads him to notice the ferocious claws and sharp teeth. In other cases, perhaps, the initial appraisal was incorrect, and the search does not uncover any evidence. Either way, contrary to the Perceptual Model, the evidence could only ever be those objective properties of the emotion's intentional object, such as the ferociousness of the claws or sharpness of the teeth, that constitute or explain the relevant value. The mere fact that one feels the emotion is not, in any measure, evidence for the corresponding evaluative belief.

Brady still thinks emotional experience can nonetheless act as a reason for the evaluative beliefs, albeit a proxy or pro tempore reason: "[emotions] are . . . useful stand-ins or surrogates for genuine reasons for evaluative beliefs, but lack that status themselves" (129). For example, when afraid of the lion, I may treat this fear as supporting the belief that danger is present. Even in such cases, whatever justification is gained through this method only derives from the objective properties that constitute or explain the relevant value, e.g., that which makes the lion dangerous. This conclusion is supported as follows: were I to engage in the necessary rational reflection, and learn that the lion's danger consists in his ferocious claws and sharp teeth, the additional fact that I am also afraid adds no more justification for the belief that danger is present.

However, the fact that we do not typically rest content with forming our beliefs on the basis of such pro tempore reasons is supposed to show something significant about emotions and ourselves. Brady contrasts knowledge with another kind of cognitive success: understanding. Understanding is defined as the satisfaction for our curiosity, as well as the natural termination for inquiry. As such, understanding does not simply consist in knowing truths; understanding is being able to grasp genuine conceptual and explanatory connections among truths. This distinction extends to emotions, because while knowing that the lion is dangerous or that some behavior is a form of disrespect may be valuable or useful in many ways, knowledge may not be enough. We want to understand why something is dangerous or an action disrespectful, and by implication, what constitutes danger or disrespect. According to Brady, people have the goal of understanding why things -- and specifically the objects of our emotions -- have the value properties they have. The attribution of this goal is supported by two points: firstly, evaluative understanding is a requisite part of moral development, since the morally decent person does not simply know that certain actions are bad, wrong, harmful, or shameful, etc., but also understands why they are so. Secondly, understanding the objects of our emotions is a stable and effective means to regulate emotions themselves.

Given that people generally have the goal of evaluative understanding, the distinctive epistemic role of emotions comes into relief. As we have already seen, on Brady's view, emotions (through the capture and consumption of attention) facilitate seeking out and discovering those objective properties that are reasons for our emotions and the corresponding value judgments. However, evaluative understanding just is the recognition and articulation of the reasons why something is valuable or not. It follows therefore that emotions facilitate evaluative understanding. In so doing, they help us meet a goal the achievement of which is necessary to moral development and proper self-regulation. By contrast, Brady argues, the Perceptual model seriously understates the epistemic value of emotion. Perceptions, unlike emotions, do not move us to seek out reasons that bear our empirical beliefs about the world. They thus do not facilitate understanding.

However, the conclusion that emotions facilitate understanding admits two different interpretations. On the one hand, as Brady puts it, emotions raise "justificatory questions" about themselves, and evaluative understanding is their "function" or what the emotion "motivates" (97, 109, 177). These statements suggest the very strong claim that emotion is a self-critical type of mentality, one which constitutively aims at understanding. By contrast, the same conclusion could be put more weakly: emotions, when consulted by a properly motivated and suitably skilled epistemic agent, yield understanding. According to this weaker claim, emotions can be epistemically quite valuable, but if the person who has the emotion is not properly motivated or fails to meet other conditions, then the emotion would be at best epistemically neutral or even bad. On the strong claim, the motivation to evaluative understanding is internal to emotion, and is part of its very essence, whereas on the weaker, the motivation must be supplied from elsewhere.

While the weaker claim is eminently reasonable, given that emotions capture and consume attention, it is not clear why the stronger claim should be accepted. First, the stronger claim does not follow, at least not without auxiliary assumptions, from the mere fact that emotions capture and consume attention. Even if people typically feel the burden of justification, and seek out reasons why the emotion is justified, it does not follow that the emotion constitutively aims at evaluative understanding. Where the burden of justification is felt, it could be that the rational reflection shouldering that burden is due significantly to other special motivations that, as a matter of empirical fact, are present together with the emotion. Perhaps only a person who is already concerned with and interested in truth or becoming a virtuous agent or regulating her emotions will avail herself of the opportunity for understanding which the emotion provides. Since, as Brady accepts, these motives may be widely held, it is easy to blur their contribution with that of the emotion.

Secondly, there are independent grounds to doubt whether emotions constitutively aim at evaluative understanding. Specifically, emotions distort and mislead. As Peter Goldie memorably said, emotions can "skew the epistemic landscape."[2] Anger is a usual suspect: for example, a person may get angry as a way of shifting blame upon another party. This phenomenon is familiar to anybody who has dared to honk at careless, negligent, or dangerous drivers. The dangerous driver's anger in response to being confronted does not attempt to accurately understand the situation, in which he is responsible for nearly causing an accident, but rather attempts to re-establish the situation in a way more conducive to his desires, needs, and interests. Other usual suspects include pride, disgust, joy, and sadness. Of course, these distorting and misleading emotions cannot be defended as epistemically rational. However, the point of such emotions is not to be rational, but is rather to disregard the truth in favor of untruths and half-truths that are more desirable.

The distorting power of emotions is due to the capture and consumption of attention, no less than it is due to the initial 'quick and dirty' appraisals. Specifically, the objective value properties one notices (or does not notice) to support one's appraisals are sometimes, and arguably tend to be, highly biased. This possibility is illustrated in rationalization, where one exaggerates or confabulates evidence. For example, a person may display ingenuity and rational skill in defending her anger as legitimate and righteous. This ingenuity is due, at least in part, to the angry person being more likely to notice and find evidence for wrongdoing. Brady does discuss rationalization, noting "the urge to discover reasons . . . is often so strong that when individuals cannot discover genuine reasons, they are inclined to invent them" (88). The rationalizer, he thinks, earnestly tries to find out the truth, but resorts to rationalization as a second-best option. Brady does not consider that the rationalizer may not be interested in truth whatsoever, but rather in avoiding anxiety and pain, protecting self-esteem, status, or a favorable perception held by other people. The emotion may put, and keep, these non-cognitive aims at the fore, while other motivations and capacities extrinsic to the emotion are needed for the attention to yield understanding.

Admittedly, Brady acknowledges that emotions, and the capture and consumption of attention, are sometimes epistemically bad. In the final chapter, he discusses various examples under this heading, including emotions that persist past the recognition that they are unjustified, emotions where the person cannot or will not reflect further, and others. His solution, however, is that the emotion must be regulated by evaluative understanding to avoid such difficulties. Evaluative understanding ensures that the person is not "overly reflective . . . [but] nevertheless reflective enough" (186). Such a person re-considers emotions when she does not adequately understand their objects, but may also trust her emotions (as proxies) when the value of their objects is well-understood. Understanding will also make it less likely that she will rationalize her emotions, or that those emotions will persist past the recognition that they are unjustified (177-178). Such a solution, it seems to me, is problematic for the stronger interpretation of the emotion's epistemic role for at least two reasons. Firstly, it amounts to a concession that what facilitates understanding is not quite the emotion itself, but rather the emotion together with other non-essential epistemic and psychological conditions. If so, the motivation to understand could be part of, or derive from, the other non-essential epistemic and psychological conditions. In such a scenario, the stronger claim that emotions constitutively aim at understanding would be false. Secondly, it remains unanswered how the emotion facilitates understanding for those who do not already possess understanding. An answer is needed, if the stronger claim is true. It may be that emotions can generate understanding on their own, out of nothing, as it were. But that account has not been offered yet, and it would have to address how (as Brady admits) emotions can be epistemically very bad when not regulated by prior evaluative understanding.

None of the foregoing disputes that emotions can or commonly do contribute to our evaluative understanding in the way Brady suggests, via the capture and consumption of attention. I only resist blurring what is essential to emotion with what empirically accompanies emotion in the psychology of mature, rational agents. Nevertheless, the book remains impressive. It systematizes the various theories that have fallen under the Perceptual Model, and clarifies their key claims. More impressively, it musters a charitable and fair criticism of the Perceptual Model, as well as defending an interesting and powerful alternative, based around two exceedingly important (and to my mind both reasonable and true) claims, i.e., that emotions can themselves be justified or unjustified, and also that emotions capture and consume attention. It develops from these claims a fascinating account of how much we can learn from our emotions, and how much emotions add to our epistemic standing. Emotional Insight thus constitutes definitive progress for the pro-emotion consensus, while recognizing some limits and counter-evidence to that paradigm. The author's patient approach to criticism, unwavering clarity, and plain old philosophical good sense make the book an unparalleled entry to debates about emotions and knowledge.


Thanks to Michael Brady for discussing my questions about his work and reading a draft of this review.

[1] Karen Jones, "Quick and Smart? Modularity and the pro-Emotion Consensus," in Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Supplement, 32: The Modularity of Emotions, ed. Luc Faucher and Christine Tappolet (University of Calgary Press, 2006), 3-28.

[2] Peter Goldie, "Emotion, Feeling, and Knowledge of the World," in Thinking about Feeling: Contemporary Philosophers on Emotions, ed. Robert C. Solomon (Oxford University Press, 2004), 91-106.