Emotions, Values, and Agency

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Christine Tappolet, Emotions, Values, and Agency, Oxford University Press, 2016, 228pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696512.

Reviewed by Benjamin De Mesel, KU Leuven


What are emotions? Christine Tappolet defends the claim that emotions consist in perceptual experiences of evaluative properties, such as the fearsome, the disgusting, or the admirable. An outline of the Perceptual Theory of emotions (Chapter 1) is followed by an exploration of its implications for the relations between emotion and motivation (Chapter 2), emotion and values (Chapter 3), emotion and responsibility (Chapter 4), and emotion and agency (Chapter 5).

Tappolet's book is to be recommended, first of all, for the way in which it shows how her theory of emotion interlocks with plausible theories of value and agency, and how these interlocking theories mutually support each other. The project is ambitious, as it requires a grasp of the difficulties in different and vast fields of inquiry, but the book lives up to its ambition: it is rich, accessibly written, well-structured, and extremely well-informed. It is focused, in the sense that in many cases it provides just the right amount of information about the theories discussed.

Chapter 1 starts with an overview of the main theories of emotion on offer: Feeling Theories, Conative Theories, and Cognitive Theories, such as the Judgmental and Quasi-Judgmental Theories. These theories are all found wanting, and an alternative theory, the Perceptual Theory, is introduced on the basis of analogies between emotions and sensory experiences, understood as paradigmatic perceptual experiences.

Not all analogies are as clear as Tappolet presents them. A main reason is that, in my view, much about (sense-)perception is assumed. In contrast to the way Tappolet treats emotion, values and agency, no overview of theories of perception, and no defense of a particular theory, is provided (although a brief account of perception is offered on pp. 29-30). That is a pity, because some of Tappolet's claims about perception are controversial.

I will briefly mention three examples. First, Tappolet seems to adopt a representationalist account of perception. Second, perceptions are taken to have phenomenal properties. To perceive red involves having a certain experience; there is something it is like to see red (p. 19). Third, Tappolet claims that sensory experiences have correctness conditions (p. 20). A sensory experience can be correct or incorrect, and if it is correct, we have a perception. These three points are controversial.[1] That does not mean, of course, that no defense is possible; it only means that some defense is required: what is claimed about perception is part of an account of perception (as I see it, a representationalist and causal account) that should not be assumed.

Tappolet's assumptions about perception and sensory experience are not innocuous: without them, some of the appeal of the Perceptual Theory is lost. The theory is based on what are taken to be important analogies between emotion and sensory experiences. Three of these analogies are that both emotions and sensory experiences (1) represent the world as being a certain way, (2) are characterized by phenomenal properties and (3) have correctness conditions. Tappolet mainly argues for the truth of these claims insofar as they relate to emotion, but tends to assume their truth insofar as they relate to sensory experiences. If the claims are not true of sensory experiences, however, the analogies do not hold.

This brings me to a methodological point. Tappolet recognizes that, although there are important analogies between emotions and paradigmatic perceptual experiences (namely, sensory experiences), there are also disanalogies. It is true that these disanalogies do not entail that emotions are not perceptual experiences. According to Tappolet, not all perceptual experiences are sensory experiences and, therefore, a disanalogy with sensory experiences does not mean that something cannot be a perceptual experience (p. 28). That argument, however, seems also to blunt the force of Tappolet's 'argument by analogy' (p. xii): can it be maintained that analogies with sensory experiences speak in favor of an account of emotions as perceptual experiences, while disanalogies with sensory experiences do not speak against it?

Tappolet may be right when she claims that some disanalogies may not be as deep as they first appear (p. 27). The idea is that if they are not as deep as they appear, the disanalogies do not have the same weight as the analogies, and the argument by analogy succeeds. The fact that Tappolet lists the disanalogies (pp. 24-31) and takes them seriously is certainly praiseworthy. Nevertheless, some worries about the disanalogies remain, not in the least because some of them do not merely seem to be disanalogies between emotions and sensory experiences, but between emotions and perceptual experiences. As long as there are such disanalogies, the claim that emotions are perceptual experiences will be endangered. First, some disanalogies that are not listed seem important. Take, for example, the idea that we can have perceptual experiences for a fraction of a second, while it seems conceptually strange to say that someone has an emotion (intense jealousy, for example, or a consuming rage) for only a fraction of a second.[2] Conversely, we can feel angry with someone for years, but is it possible to have a perceptual experience for years? Second, some disanalogies are mentioned but not addressed, such as the fact that emotions are valenced (there are negative and positive ones) and have polar opposites, while perceptual experiences neither are valenced nor have polar opposites. The features of having degrees, being valenced, and having polar opposites are used later in the book in order to show that there are important structural differences between the case of values and the case of responsibility (pp. 133-145). At first sight, then, it seems as if they could as well be used to argue that there are important structural differences between the case of emotions and the case of perceptual experiences.

An important disanalogy between emotions and sensory experiences is that 'unlike the latter emotions can be assessed in terms of rationality' (p. 31). Tappolet provides an explanation of this difference that I endorse.[3] The question is, however, what place such an explanation can take in an argument that purports to show that emotions are perceptual experiences. There are, I think, two options. First, the irrationality disanalogy can be presented, as Tappolet does, as a disanalogy between emotions and sensory experiences. If it is only that, it is not clear why it would threaten the Perceptual Theory, given Tappolet's earlier claim that a disanalogy with sensory experiences does not mean that something cannot be a perceptual experience, because not all perceptual experiences are sensory experiences. Secondly, and more plausibly, the irrationality disanalogy is a disanalogy between emotions and perceptual experiences. However, Tappolet's explanation of the disanalogy will then amount to an implicit recognition of the fact that emotions are not perceptual experiences. It will then count against, and not in favor of, the Perceptual Theory. What the Perceptual Theory needs, in this case, is not for the difference to be explained, but for it somehow to be explained away: contrary to how things seem, there is in fact no disanalogy between emotions and perceptual experiences. Such an explanation is not attempted, but seems necessary: if emotions can be (ir)rational, (un)reasonable and/or (in)appropriate, and emotions are perceptual experiences, then how can it seem conceptually incoherent to say that perceptual experiences are (ir)rational, (un)reasonable and/or (in)appropriate?

In short, I believe, first, that some of the alleged analogies between emotions and perceptual experiences are less obvious and that some of the disanalogies are more serious than Tappolet makes it seem. Second, I suspect that some worries about disanalogies could be mitigated by taking a closer look at some distinctions in the theory of perception. I am thinking, in particular, of the Wittgensteinian distinction between 'seeing' and 'seeing-as'. While it cannot be inappropriate or irrational to see a rabbit, it can be inappropriate or irrational to see a rabbit as a chair. While seeing is not as plastic as emotions are (it is not subject to important changes over the lifetime of an individual) (p. 26), seeing-as seems just plastic enough. Third, some conceptual problems for the Perceptual Theory are not discussed. One is the perception of emotion: I can see, for example, your sadness, or hear it, or feel it. If emotions would be perceptual experiences, it would be possible to see your perceptual experience, or to hear it or feel it. But the latter statements may seem conceptually incoherent.[4] Something similar seems to hold for emotions about emotions: I can feel sad about your anger, or admire your love for your husband. But does that imply that I feel sad about your perceptual experience, or admire it? I can be in the grip of an emotion, or be full of it, but can I be in the grip of a perceptual experience, or be full of it? I can give way to my emotions or bring them under control, give expression to them or suppress them, but can I give way to my perceptual experiences, bring them under control, give expression to them (not equivalent to 'report them') or suppress them?[5]

The second chapter is devoted to a discussion of the relation between emotion and motivation. The central idea is that emotions can be contemplative, which means that no desires at all need to be involved in having an emotion. Tappolet argues that, as a consequence, there is no deep asymmetry with respect to motivation between emotions and sensory experiences.

The third chapter is the strongest. Tappolet shows how her Perceptual Theory of emotions (emotions are perceptual experiences of evaluative properties) naturally fits with Representational Neo-Sentimentalism about value concepts (x is V if and only if x is such that feeling E is correct in response to x, if one were to contemplate x, where V is an affective value and E the corresponding attitude) and a form of realism (Sentimental Realism) about evaluative properties. The match between these independently plausible theories counts in favor of all of them. While philosophers tend to evaluate these theories in isolation from each other, the chief merit of this book is that it makes clear how the theories can be integrated.

One of the most interesting parts of Chapter 3 concerns Tappolet's answers to circularity threats for Representational Neo-Sentimentalism (pp. 98-103). She makes two helpful distinctions. First, the biconditional does not aim at providing the application conditions of evaluative concepts (it will not help us to decide whether an evaluative concept applies in a particular case), but it aims at providing the possession conditions of evaluative concepts (and these conditions involve experiencing emotional responses and grounding one's evaluative judgments on these responses). Second, the biconditional does not aim at the reduction of a concept into elementary components, but at elucidation. According to Tappolet's 'no-priority view', the aim of elucidation is to throw light on a concept by spelling out its ties with other concepts.[6] These two distinctions make it possible to avoid many criticisms against Neo-Sentimentalism.[7]

Chapter 4 focuses on Strawsonian accounts of moral responsibility. According to such accounts, an agent is morally responsible just in case certain emotions, such as resentment, are appropriate with respect to the agent, given what she has done (p. 124). Although such accounts appear to share many essential features with Neo-Sentimentalism, and therefore to be supported by Tappolet's defense of Neo-Sentimentalism, the chapter is devoted to showing that the appearance is deceptive. In fact, Tappolet claims, moral responsibility is in many ways disanalogous to evaluative properties (it is not valenced, has no degrees, there are no polar opposites, etc.). The relation between moral responsibility and emotions is, in contrast to what Strawsonians think, indirect, because it is mediated by the evaluative properties of praiseworthiness and blameworthiness.

I agree with many of the points made in this chapter, but I am not sure whether they really add up to a problem for Strawsonian accounts of moral responsibility. Consider, for example, a Strawsonian principle for morally responsible action formulated by Michael McKenna:

(N-Action): S is morally responsible for action x in the sense of being praiseworthy or blameworthy for it if and only if it would be pro tanto appropriate to hold S morally responsible for action x by praising or blaming her.[8]

Tappolet does not spell out the exact relation between praiseworthiness and blameworthiness (the evaluative properties directly related to emotions), on the one hand, and moral responsibility, on the other hand. McKenna's principle, however, suggests that what Strawsonians may be after is an account of moral responsibility for something in the sense of being praiseworthy or blameworthy for it. If that is the sense of moral responsibility at issue, then one could say, roughly (and overlooking moral responsibility for morally neutral acts), that, according to Strawsonians, to be morally responsible for something is to be blameworthy or praiseworthy for it. Tappolet might say, rightly, that this has to be established, and that the burden of proof is on the Strawsonians. Nevertheless, if moral responsibility is (nothing more than) blameworthiness or praiseworthiness, many of Tappolet's disanalogies between evaluative properties and moral responsibility will disappear: blameworthiness and praiseworthiness are polar opposites, have degrees, and are valenced.

An interesting point in Chapter 4 targets Strawsonian accounts of moral responsibility such as that of Jay Wallace, 'according to which the conditions under which reactive attitudes are appropriate are given a substantive specification' (p. 148). Why not say, then, that someone is responsible if and only if the substantive conditions are satisfied, and leave out the reactive attitudes? Tappolet regards this so-called 'Middleman Objection' as a serious objection to Strawsonian accounts of moral responsibility, because it shows that the reactive attitudes are not really indispensable, but one of her own distinctions might help to respond to it. What if, for example, the Strawsonian biconditional specifies possession conditions for moral responsibility, while substantive conditions for moral responsibility have to be understood as application conditions? Both substantive conditions and the reactive attitudes could then be indispensable to a full account of moral responsibility.

Chapter 5 deals with the relation between emotions and agency. Tappolet defends the Tracking Thesis, according to which 'in so far as emotions are perceptions of values, they can be considered to be perceptions of practical reasons' (p. 162). She also highlights the connection between emotions and epistemic reasons and proposes that we are able to be reason-responsive when we act on our emotions.

I recommend this book to anyone interested in emotions, motivation, values, moral responsibility, and agency. Tappolet has illuminating things to say about all of these matters and, in particular, about the ways in which they interconnect. Her ambitious project has succeeded.[9]

[1] Against representationalist accounts of perception, see Charles Travis, Perception, Oxford University Press, 2013. Against the idea that perceptions necessarily have phenomenal properties, see Oswald Hanfling, 'Wittgenstein and the Problem of Consciousness', in his Wittgenstein and the Human Form of Life, Routledge, 2002, pp. 104-127 (pp. 118-122). Against the idea that sensory experiences have correctness conditions, see P.M.S. Hacker, 'Perception', in his The Intellectual Powers. A Study of Human Nature, Wiley-Blackwell, 2013, pp. 286-315 (pp. 309-315).

[2] See Ronald de Sousa, 'Emotion', in Edward Zalta (ed.), The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2014 Edition).

[3] See Benjamin De Mesel, 'Seeing Color, Seeing Emotion, Seeing Moral Value', The Journal of Value Inquiry 50 (3), 539-555 (sections 2 and 3).

[4] On seeing-as and the perception of emotion, see my 'Seeing Color, Seeing Emotion, Seeing Moral Value'.

[5] Some of these characteristics of emotions are discussed in M.R. Bennett and P.M.S. Hacker, 'Emotion', in their Philosophical Foundations of Neuroscience, Blackwell, 2003, pp. 199-223.

[6] See also Christine Tappolet, 'Value and Emotions', in Iwao Hirose and Jonas Olson (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Value Theory, Oxford University Press, 2015, pp. 80-95.

[7] See also my 'Is Moral Responsibility Essentially Interpersonal? A Reply to Zimmerman', The Journal of Ethics (Online First Articles), section 4.

[8] Michael McKenna, Conversation and Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2012, p. 38.

[9] Thanks to Christine Tappolet for helpful comments.