Emotions, Values, and the Law

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John Deigh, Emotions, Values, and the Law, Oxford University Press, 2008, 243pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195169324.

Reviewed by Bryce Huebner, Tufts University


According to the view that currently dominates empirical moral psychology, emotions are -- to a large extent -- causally responsible for the structure of our moral judgments. The pages of well-known psychology journals include data suggesting that the appearance of disorder and the smell of human flatulence tend to evoke harsher appraisals of moral transgressions; analogously, a person who is in an elevated mood after watching a Chris Farley skit from Saturday Night Live will be more likely to find it acceptable to push a fat man in front of an oncoming trolley. Such results have made their way into the mainstream news media, but most moral philosophers are nonplussed by such results. To many, it is unclear why emotional reactions that evolved to alert us to danger and to keep us away from indigestible items would play a role in our moral judgments. Does this mean that our moral psychology is driven by emotions that cannot be rationally assessed? Such data lend themselves nicely to a Humean theory of value that sees our moral judgments as reflexive, affectively laden responses that spread value onto the world. But, if our emotional reactions are themselves amenable to rational assessment, and if they are grounded in non-affective facts about the world, perhaps such data are really innocuous. In this case, these data would only tell us that we could be misled -- that psychologists have really only uncovered clever strategies for producing moral illusions.

John Deigh's Emotions, Values, and the Law collects ten essays (eight previously published) that attempt to show that emotions are intentional states that are rationally assessable and that can play an important role in allowing us to perceive the moral and aesthetic values that things in our world have. Many of these essays are widely available, and this gave me pause when I cracked the book's spine. Faced with a number of papers that I had read previously, I wondered what value could be added by putting these papers in a single collection. Much to my surprise, the benefit of rereading some of these essays together was enough to partially assuage my worries. The first five essays provide a coherent set of criticisms leveled against existing theories, and they offer an account that explains the role of emotions in moral and aesthetic judgments; chapter seven includes a further elaboration of the positive theory. The remaining essays dangle, showing only a loose connection to the theory and the themes that have been developed over the first five chapters -- I return to this worry in the concluding paragraph of this review.

The key assumption in this book is that emotions must be able to play a role in explaining thought and action. One gets a sense for what Deigh thinks this entails in the concluding paragraph of the preface, where he reports his skepticism about the role of neurophysiological data in helping us to understand emotions: our evaluative judgments are in no way beholden to the activity in the medial insula, anterior cingulate, or caudate nucleus (p. xv). Rather than looking to such physiological data, an account of emotion is better served by developing an understanding of the sort of intentional content that emotions have such that they can be "proper objects of rational assessment" (p. 40). However, Deigh also wishes to avoid an intellectualist view that treats emotions as "discrete, episodic, and purely affective states of consciousness" (p. 3). Looking to the history of psychology, we find two initially promising approaches to resisting an overly intellectual view of emotion. The first follows William James, taking emotions to be epiphenomena, nothing more than the feeling of a change in our bodies following from our perceptual experiences. The second follows Sigmund Freud, taking emotions to be contentful and meaningful unconscious states, expressed through our feelings but not reducible to them.

Deigh offers a forceful argument against Jamesian approaches to emotion and their Darwinian allies. By reducing emotions to feelings, physiological states, and facial expressions, they explain the emotional capacities that are shared by non-human animals, human infants, and human adults. But they do this at the high cost of abandoning the sort of intentional content that is required if emotions are to be amenable to rational assessment or to play an intelligible role in explanations of human behavior. These are the familiar objections to Jamesian theories that have often been taken to speak in favor of cognitivist views that treat emotions as species of evaluative judgments. However, Deigh also argues that although such theories offer a clear account of the intentionality and rationality of emotional representations, they cannot explain how such capacities could be present in non-human animals and human infants that lack the capacity for propositional representation. With these criticisms in mind, Deigh argues that only the Freudian approach offers a plausible understanding of the role of emotion in explaining our thoughts and behaviors; moreover, only Freud's approach allows us to recognize feelings as meaningful expressions of emotion as opposed to epiphenomenal states that do nothing more than register changes in our bodies (p. 10). In short, Deigh's goal is to fulfill the Freudian legacy by providing an account of the intentional content of emotions that does not require an overly intellectual view of content, but that can still allow for emotions that are evaluative judgments.

Deigh's positive proposal is a friendly amendment to the cognitivist theories that he criticizes. He does not identify every emotion with an evaluative judgment; but he does identify many emotions with evaluative judgments. He distinguishes primitive emotions from tutored emotions and argues that the education that children receive early in life facilitates a fundamental transformation in the sort of intentional content that an emotion can possess. The intentional content of a primitive emotion (i.e., the type that we share with "infants and beasts") is exhaustively specified in terms of perceptual contents. Vervet monkeys experience fear at the sight of a circling eagle not because they judge eagles to be dangerous, but because they immediately perceive eagles as scary. Tutored fear, by contrast, is evoked in the evaluative judgment that something is dangerous. The intentional content of a tutored emotion is conceptual and is established through the education that a child receives early in her life as she learns which things are proper objects of various emotions (p. 117). Although some things will continue to evoke fear merely because we perceive them as scary, we also come to internalize particular evaluative judgments about the dangers that some things pose independently of their brute perceptual properties. Since tutored emotions are evaluative judgments, persons who experience them can properly be criticized. For example, it seems clear that someone who relies on phenotypic markers of race to evaluate whether someone is dangerous is making a mistake. Her evaluations garner no epistemic warrant, and she is properly criticized for holding such a view.

With this view of emotion in hand, Deigh turns to Humean theories of value. He argues that those feelings of disgust (or contempt, or sympathy, etc.) that express primitive emotions cannot be counted as perceptions of value. Primitive disgust may lead us to withdraw. However, for a feeling of disgust to play an intelligible role in explaining our moral and aesthetic judgments, it must be disgust that is expressed in accordance with an evaluative judgment that something truly is revolting. The disgust that we feel toward a sleazy senator is quite distinct, claims Deigh, from the disgust that we feel when we smell something gross. Thus, returning to the examples with which I began, it is open to the person who is told that her moral judgments were influenced by the smell of flatulence to claim that she made a mistake in treating her feeling of disgust as grounds for moral disapprobation. By recognizing the difference between primitive and tutored emotions, Deigh hopes to gain some ground on the role of emotions in our moral psychology. Tutored emotions allow us to perceive value in the world. But they do so because they are grounded in structures of evaluative judgment that are richer than the perceptual stimuli that evoke primitive emotions.

Such is the view advanced by Deigh in the six essays that form the core of this book. The criticisms he raises have come to play an important role in philosophical debates about the nature of emotion -- and no doubt they will continue to do so for quite some time. As Deigh (p. ix) himself notes, there have been attempts to reformulate cognitivist theories in light of his concerns -- I will not address these moves here. However, Deigh also dismisses Jamesian approaches to emotion on the basis of well-worn concerns about intentionality and intelligibility. Such objections may have been sufficient when no plausible Jamesian theory was on offer. However, Jesse Prinz has recently defended a Jamesian theory that accounts for the intentionality of emotional representations by developing a causal theory of emotional content that can underwrite what he calls 'embodied appraisals'. Prinz acknowledges that his theory of emotion can only count agents who act on emotions that misrepresent the world as irrational, and Deigh seems to want to treat emotions themselves as rational or irrational. However, Deigh does not explain why it is that the emotions themselves have to be subject to rational assessment. Indeed, it seems that Prinz's proposal can allow for agents who acknowledge that their emotional reactions have misrepresented and that acting or judging on their basis was irrational. In short, although Prinz concedes that emotions are reflexive changes in bodily states, and hence not open to rational criticism; however, he also argues that emotional representations often do trigger conceptual representations that then play an important role in the production of intentional actions. This means that on Prinz's view a person can be criticized for acting on the basis of an emotional misrepresentation. Yet, she ought not be criticized for emotionally representing the world as she does. There is room for debate over whether such a view does justice to our ordinary understanding of the role that emotions must play in the explanation of behavior. Given that Prinz's view has been in the air for some time (and given that the anthology where the second essay of this volume first appeared also includes a paper in which Prinz advances his view), it would have been nice to see how Deigh would respond to such a contemporary Jamesian theory.

I believe, however, that the fact that Deigh does not address Prinz's view is indicative of a more troubling worry. Deigh draws an untenably sharp distinction between primitive perceptual emotions and tutored evaluative emotions. It is not at all obvious that there are any primitive emotions to be found that will accord precisely with the view that is advanced by Deigh. Returning to the case I utilized above in discussing primitive emotions, there is at least anecdotal evidence to suggest that Vervet monkeys that have been raised in captivity do not display the fear of snakes that would seem to be essential to their survival in the wild; in one case where captive Vervet monkeys were exposed to a five-foot-long king snake, a mother who was carrying a 6-month-old baby walked up to the snake and picked up a grape that was on the floor, showing no fear response whatsoever (Marc Hauser, personal correspondence). This suggests that even the primitive fear response to a predator may need to be learned. But if this is the case, then there may not be any obvious way to distinguish between the kinds of intentional content that we find in tutored emotions and the kind of intentional content that we find in so-called primitive emotions. People are currently working on ways in which emotions with relatively little content can be elaborated so that they can provide a foundation for our moral judgments -- and all this without treating emotions as judgments of any sort. Deigh does discuss, and dismiss, the work of Paul Rozin. However, recent work by Rozin, as well as work by Jon Haidt and Jesse Prinz, has suggested ways in which the content of an emotional representation can be associated with various sorts of socially significant stimuli. Even more intriguingly, Paul Griffiths has recently argued that all emotions are action-oriented representations, and that emotional appraisals are not merely evaluating the structure of the world, but they are also anticipating the likely behaviors of other agents in response to an exhibited emotion. While such a theory clearly has some affinity with the view that is advanced by Deigh, it would have been nice to see how Deigh would respond to the various accounts of how emotions allow us to evaluate the socially important properties of our environment.

In short, while this book only addresses a small range of the literature on the nature of our emotions, it does so in a clear and engaging way. Deigh's writing is clear and precise, his arguments are strong, and he uses a wide range of real world examples that give his essays a vibrant and very readable character. However, the reliance on previously published material left me wanting to hear more about how the theory contends with its more wily opponents. In closing, let me briefly address the four remaining essays that lie outside of the main focus of the book. While I strongly believe that the discussion in "Emotions and the Authority of Law" that attempts to ground legal authority in an emotional bond between the subjects and the law that is analogous to the bond between mother and child (p. 147) is a well conceived addition to the volume, I am less convinced that the final three essays contribute to the theme of the book in the same way. "Promises under Fire" defends Hume's view that "the existence of social conventions that constitute the act of promising is essential to generating the obligation to keep a promise" (p. 171). "Moral Agency and Criminal Insanity" defends the viability of the insanity defense by showing that actions that are the direct result of some mental disorders cannot be seen as arising from a capacity for moral agency. And "Liberalism and Freedom" offers an argument for the claim that freedom in a liberal society need not be seen as resulting from the free exercise of the will. Each of these essays is interesting in its own right, and I quite enjoyed reading them. However, given the narrow range of positions that is addressed in the first half of the book, my preference would have been to see how Deigh's view of emotions, and of the relations between emotion and value, faired against its strongest contemporary opponents.