Emotive Language in Argumentation

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Fabrizio Macagno and Douglas Walton, Emotive Language in Argumentation, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 292pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107676657.

Reviewed by Gary N. Curtis, The Fallacy Files (www.fallacyfiles.org)


Douglas Walton, a prolific and influential writer on logical fallacies and related subjects, has co-written this book with communication researcher Fabrizio Macagno. Walton's earlier, The Place of Emotion in Argument (Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, 1992) dealt with traditional logical fallacies -- such as the appeals to pity and fear -- in which emotions play an obvious role, but emotional language was only touched on in passing. The emphasis of the current book is the reverse of the previous one, that is, it concerns the emotional aspects of words and definitions, seldom mentioning the fallacies of appeal to emotion.

Macagno and Walton discuss two main ways that emotive language can enter into argumentation:

1.     "Loaded" language (chapters 1 and 2): This refers to words that have a positive or negative emotional "charge" in addition to their literal meaning. Charles L. Stevenson, in Ethics and Language (Yale University Press, New Haven, 1965, pp.78-79) drew a useful distinction between "dependent" and "independent" emotive words. An emotive word is "dependent" if its emotional charge depends on the word's literal meaning, that is, its referent or extension. For example, words such as "war" and "mother" have strong emotive charges because wars and mothers arouse strong emotions. In contrast, an emotive word is "independent" if it is not dependent, that is, its emotive charge does not depend on the emotional effect of the word's literal meaning. For instance, the negative emotive charge of "beast" is independent of its literal meaning of animal. Of course, the distinction between dependent and independent emotive words is a vague one, and few if any words are purely one or the other.

2.     Persuasive definitions (chapters 3 and 4): The term "persuasive definition" appears to have been coined by Stevenson in a paper with that title (Mind 47 (187): 331-350) and is discussed in his book (chapter 9). A "persuasive" definition is a type of redefinition of a word that is emotive in the sense just explained. Stevenson notes that the supposed persuasiveness of such definitions comes from a characteristic of emotive words:

A particularly interesting phenomenon depends upon the "inertia", so to speak, of meaning. Suppose . . . that a term's laudatory emotive meaning has arisen solely because its descriptive meaning refers to something which people favor. And suppose that a given speaker succeeds in changing the descriptive meaning of the term . . . One might expect that the emotive meaning will undergo a parallel change, automatically. But in fact it often will not. Through inertia, it will survive a change in the descriptive meaning on which it originally depended. (p. 72)

So, when a persuasive definition of an emotive word redefines the word's literal meaning, its emotive charge lingers for at least awhile. In this way, the redefined word is supposed to persuade by affecting one's emotional attitude towards its new referent or extension at least for the time that it retains its charge.

What are Macagno and Walton's goals? Unfortunately, I'm not clear about what questions they hoped to answer, but here are some I came to the book with:

1.     What is the logical status of arguments that use emotive language? According to standard logical terminology, arguments are valid or invalid, sound or unsound, no matter what emotive language they are expressed in. So, it would seem that such language is simply logically irrelevant and, as a consequence, any argument that persuades based on the emotive language in which it is expressed would commit a fallacy of irrelevance. If this is correct, then a logical study of emotive language in argument is the study of a type of logical fallacy.

However, Macagno and Walton take a broader view of argument that is not limited to deduction, but allows for "presumptive" reasoning (pp. 180-195)[1] in which one is allowed to presume that something is true in the absence of specific evidence against it. For instance, we presume that a bird can fly unless we know that it's an ostrich, has a broken wing, or there is some other specific reason why it cannot. Now, I'm all for this kind of reasoning, but there doesn't seem any more of a place in it for arguments that use emotive language in a non-eliminable way than in deductive arguments. If a presumption were based in an essential way upon an emotion, then this would seem to be a specific reason for rejecting it.

2.     What is the ethical status of argumentation using emotive language? I place this question second because it would seem to depend on the answer to the first. If persuasion based on emotive language is a species of logical fallacy, it would seem to deserve the same moral condemnation that fallacious argumentation in general usually receives. Emotions are often intimately related to beliefs and, as a result, can be based on rational or irrational beliefs. There is perhaps, then, a sense in which the use of an emotive word "presupposes" a belief that would make the emotion aroused by the word rational.[2] For instance, the use of frightening language may presuppose that there is danger. Arousing emotions that are not justified in a situation seems to be a type of deception, and thus subject to the same moral strictures as deception in general. When the emotional reactions it arouses are justified, emotive language may not be deceptive, but it still treats adult people as if they are children or animals to be manipulated by emotions rather than reason. Of course, there may be situations in which such manipulation would be justified, such as imminent threats in which time is of the essence.

3.     Does emotively charged language really persuade? Writers on argumentation take it for granted that emotive language actually affects attitudes, but it's at least possible that emotional appeals have little or no tendency to persuade people, that the effect is much less than we usually suppose, or that it may rhetorically backfire and alienate the audience. Now, I'm not especially skeptical about the persuasiveness of emotive language, but experience suggests that it's a mistake to take such things for granted no matter how obvious they seem. Moreover, I do suspect that advertisers and propagandists tend to exaggerate the effectiveness of highly emotive advertising and propaganda. An important thing to keep in mind about advertising is what advertisers sell: advertising agencies don't sell consumer goods, they sell advertising to those who do sell such goods. Therefore, advertisers have a strong motive to exaggerate what advertising can do in order to sell advertisements. A similar story applies to professional propagandists, who must first convince politicians or parties to hire them. It would be ironic if their main achievement were to bamboozle us about the effectiveness of their products. This is not a question that I would expect Macagno and Walton to try to answer, since it's one for experimental psychology, but it should be answered before we spend a lot of time and energy on the logic or rhetoric of emotive language.

Unfortunately, the book does not seem to address any of these questions. Of course, it would be perfectly fair for Macagno and Walton to be concerned with different questions, but it's not clear what those are. As a result, it's difficult to judge to what degree the book is successful.

What tools do Macagno and Walton bring to the study of emotive language in argumentation? There are four main ones:

1.     Speech act theory (chapter 4): Persuasive definitions, as other definitions, occur in speech acts of various sorts: defining, of course, but also informing (p. 132), reminding (pp. 132-134), and declaring (pp. 135-137). Even failing to define a word can, according to the authors, constitute a speech act in situations where a definition is called for (pp. 140-142). This seems correct as a general account of defining as a speech act, but how does it advance our understanding of persuasive definitions in particular, or of emotive language in general? The supposed persuasiveness of such definitions does not seem to be related to their roles in speech acts, but on the inertia of emotive charges, as discussed above.

2.     Argument schemas: The argument schema is an extension of the traditional notion of logical form, but is not restricted to deductively valid arguments, thus allowing schemas for types of non-deductive argument, such as presumptive reasoning. Schemas are certainly useful for identifying patterns in argument for further study, but it would seem that emotive language can enter into almost any pattern of reasoning. The emotive aspect of language is a characteristic of words and phrases, similar to ambiguity, and there are thus no distinctively emotive patterns of reasoning any more than there are distinctively ambiguous patterns.

3.     Formal dialogues (Chapters 6 and 7): When first introduced by C. L. Hamblin in a paper ("Mathematical Models of Dialogue", Theoria 37 (2): 130-155) and in his influential book Fallacies (ale Press, Newport News, 1986), formal dialogues were an exciting idea. Hamblin's own efforts in this direction were promising, but not too impressive. Unfortunately, in the more than forty years since, they have not lived up to that early promise. It's still important to understand the dialectical aspect of certain fallacies, such as straw man and begging the question, but modeling them in the setting of a formal dialogue doesn't seem to help much. It may be that some advance in the underlying theory of formal dialectic is needed for their promise to be fulfilled. However, even if such dialogues should become a useful tool for understanding argumentation in general and dialectical fallacies in particular, emotive language does not appear to be a dialectical characteristic of arguments.

So far, the tools discussed seem to be the wrong ones for the job. The next tool, however, has at least one plausible application to emotive language.

4.     Presuppositions (Chapter 5): What is a presupposition? One familiar type is that which occurs in "loaded" questions, for instance, the question "Have you stopped chewing your fingernails?" presupposes that you previously chewed them, which is the "load" of the question. Macagno and Walton discuss several other types of presupposition, which I won't go into here.

How does presupposition relate to emotive language? Obviously, presuppositions need not be more emotive than any other claim, nor expressed in more emotive language. Can emotive language itself presuppose? This would seem to be Jeremy Bentham's contention in his account of what he calls "question-begging epithets" in his Handbook of Political Fallacies (Thomas Y. Crowell, New York, 1971). Bentham divided such epithets into the "eulogistic" and "disparaging" (Bentham, p. 140), for those words that have a positive and negative emotive charge, respectively. Here's his description of how such words beg the question:

To the propositions of which it is the leading term, every . . . eulogistic or disparaging epithet, secretly as it were, and in general insensibly, slips in another proposition of which the same leading term is the subject, and the assertion of praise or blame is the predicate. The person, act, or thing in question is or deserves to be, or is and deserves to be, an object of approbation or of disapprobation. The proposition thus asserted is commonly one which requires proof. But when this fallacy is committed, the proposition is one that is not true, and cannot be proved. And when the person who employs the fallacy is conscious of its deceptive tendency, his object is, by employing the artifice of the question-begging name, to cause that to be taken for true which is not so. (Bentham p. 141)

I don't mean to endorse Bentham's view but it does seem a plausible connection between emotive words and presupposition, and it explains the fallacious use of emotive language in terms of a well-established logical fallacy. Of course, not all uses of emotive language can be said to beg the question, but only those in which people substitute emotive words for reasons in a dialectical context where they bear a burden of proof. Unfortunately, Macagno and Walton do not pursue this approach, and Bentham's name does not even appear in the book.[3]

Let's turn from the substantive content of the book to matters of presentation. The writing is admirably free of unnecessary technical terminology, but is too wordy and repetitive to make for easy reading. A good editing could have reduced the length without any substantive loss. Speaking of editing, or the lack thereof, I would estimate that the book has at least one typographical error every few pages. Of course, most of these are minor, but each is like a small pothole in the road, and their number together with the length of the book makes for a long, bumpy ride.[4]

To sum up, the tools that the authors bring to bear on the problem of emotive language in argumentation seem to me either ill-suited for the job, or not put to proper use. It's a shame that the chapter on presupposition, which is its most interesting and valuable contribution to the study of argumentation, was not published separately either as a paper or short book. It would stand better on its own than as a chapter of a lengthy book on emotive language, especially since the authors only tie it indirectly to the title subject of the book. I would recommend this book to those interested in presupposition for its chapter on the subject. For those interested in the place of emotive language in argumentation, I think more would be gained from a reading or re-reading of Bentham, Stevenson, or Walton's earlier book.

[1] This appears to be the same thing as what they call "defeasible" (p. 82) or "plausible" (p. 177) reasoning.

[2] See the brief discussion of presupposition, below.

[3] It's not listed in the index, p. 282.

[4] There is at least one major mistake: on page 226, what is labeled as the structure of the third argument is actually a repetition of the structure of the second, and the structure of the third is missing.