Empathy and Morality

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Heidi L. Maibom (ed.), Empathy and Morality, Oxford University Press, 2014, 303pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199969470.

Reviewed by Karsten Stueber, College of the Holy Cross


Having the ability to empathize with another person seems to be a good thing, even a morally good thing. If asked to choose between two worlds distinguished only in respect to the existence of empathy among humans, most of us would probably choose the one where empathy exists. In light of those intuitions, which we assume to be widely shared, it seems to be rather surprising that within the Western philosophical tradition empathy as the focus of a sustained intellectual debate has existed only since the 18th century when moral sentimentalists like David Hume and Adam Smith argued for the centrality of empathy, or what they then called sympathy, in constituting moral agency. Their appreciation for empathy within the moral domain has, however, not been universally shared. More recently, even philosophers sympathetic to the sentimentalist project have voiced their skepticism in this respect (Prinz 2011a and b). For them, empathy's positive reputation within the moral domain is highly overrated, particularly in light of the results of decade-long empirical research on the relationship between empathy and moral phenomena.

Accordingly, Heidi Maibom's anthology is a very welcome and timely publication. Together with its useful introduction, which tells us "almost everything" we "ever wanted to know about empathy," its twelve contributions from a multiplicity of disciplinary perspectives (including philosophy, social psychology, psychopathology, neuroscience, anthropology and ethology) outline how we should think about empathy's contribution to moral and pro-social motivation, its contribution to moral judgment, and, more generally, its role for our social and moral life. Even if one at times would have liked a more detailed description of some of the empirical research that the various authors refer to, the anthology provides an excellent and comprehensive orientation about a topic that is at the center of the contemporary discussion about moral psychology and philosophy. The anthology should become something of a first address to "visit" for anybody wanting to familiarize themselves quickly with the state of the art research on and stances towards a rather complex topic. Nevertheless, it needs to be emphasized that the contributors mainly address the question of how empathy causally contributes to moral agency and moral judgment. They do not, with one partial exception, address the question of whether empathy plays a role in constituting or allowing us to understand the normative demands that moral judgments express and make on us. I will come back to this at the end of my review.

Since the anthology is not divided into sections I will briefly summarize and discuss each of the contributions by using mainly disciplinary criteria and thematic similarities among the various contributions. The anthology starts with three essays by well-known researchers in social and developmental psychology. Daniel Batson provides an astute and clear summary of his complex view of the relation between empathic concern, altruism and morality, which he has described more extensively in his earlier book (2011). As Batson's research has ingeniously shown, empathic concern does indeed give rise to genuine altruistic motivations that have the welfare of the other person as its ultimate goal. Yet as has also been shown such altruistic motivation should not be understood as motivation necessarily oriented or concerned with moral principles, nor is it necessarily concerned with the good of the larger community. Rather altruistic motivation activated by empathic concern is directed at the welfare of an individual. Therefore, it might override our commitments to moral principles of fairness and justice or to what is best for the community at large when those principles conflict with the welfare of an individual. For that reason, Batson distinguishes strictly between altruistic motivations and motivations guided by moral principles (principlism) or guided by the good of the collective (collectivism).

In contrast to Martin L. Hoffman (2000) he therefore does not regard empathy intrinsically to be able to strengthen our motivations for abiding by moral principles. Rather as he suggests at the end of his article, to harness the motivational force of altruism for morality requires further orchestration. In this context one wonders whether such orchestration might be helped by what Hoffman refers to as our mature ability to empathize not merely with individuals but also collectives. Moreover, Hoffman's contribution "Empathy, Justice and Social Change" complements Batson's suggestions by providing concrete means of thinking about such orchestration. As the potential final stage of his well-known developmental conception of empathy, which he briefly summarizes, Hoffman speaks nowadays of witnessing, a mode of empathizing with another person's or people's trauma that fully commits us to helping and alleviating the source of this suffering. More concretely, pointing to examples from the history of abolitionism (Harriet Beecher Stowe), the civil rights movement (Lyndon Johnson), serfdom reform in Russia (Turgenev) and various cases before the Supreme Court, Hoffman shows how empathy and empathy narratives have helped us to live up to the ideals of justice in the political and the legal realm. Yet Hoffman is fully aware of the limitations and biases of our natural empathic capacities. Nevertheless given empathy's positive influence in the real world (rather than its possible limitations revealed in the restricted environment of the psychological experiments) Hoffman continues to view empathy as the "bedrock of morality, the glue of society" whose power needs to be harnessed for the good of society.

Tracy L. Spinrad and Nancy Eisenberg round up the perspective from developmental and social psychology by surveying the empirical research and positive evidence for the causal correlation between empathy and pro-social behavior. They caution, however, that such correlation might also be due to a "third variable", such as our ability to regulate our emotions. Ultimately they suggest that further research on the contributions of genes and culture is needed in order to fully understand the nature of the correlation between empathy and prosocial behavior. Batson's skepticism about a direct link between empathy and morality is furthermore strengthened and echoed by the contribution of Giuseppe Ugazio, Jasminka Majdandžić, and Claus Lamm who also focus on empathy from a neuroscientific perspective. For them empathy, defined as involving the sharing of an affective state, is best understood as serving an epistemological role in the moral context. It allows us to gain information about the manner in which an event or action might affect a person emotionally.

Two contributions address the relation between empathy and morality from the perspective of research on psychopathology, particularly psychopathy and autism. Since both conditions are commonly associated with deficits in empathy, they have been a central focus of the discussion about whether and how empathy contributes to morality among empirically minded philosophers. Abigail A. Marsh ("Empathy and Moral Deficit in Psychopathy") provides a succinct and very helpful survey about the at times rather contradictory and confusing evidence regarding psychopaths' moral deficits. She suggests, the moral deficit of psychopaths is best understood as being related to their deficit in feeling fear and a correlated empathic deficit in recognizing and picking up information about the fear-related distress of other people. It is for that reason that psychopaths' moral deficits manifest themselves particularly in cases that focus on an individual's suffering harm. Their responses to the Trolley cases are, however, not that different from normal subjects because in those vignettes the people on the track and their suffering are barely the focus of our imaginative and empathic attention. Marsh then admits that we need to do further research in order to fully understand the moral deficits of psychopaths.

R. Peter and Jessica A. Hobson's discussion of empathy and autism ("On Empathy: A Perspective from Developmental Psychopathology"), in contrast to much of the recent discussion about morality, does not take experiments about moral judgment as the gold standard to evaluate our moral capacities. Rather, and I think importantly, they focus on empathy and its underlying mechanism of what they call "identifying-with" as a developmentally early and non-conceptual ability to "experience persons as persons" (174). It is an ability they take to be at the foundation for the developmentally later capacity to understand other persons conceptually as people with minds (different from standard accounts of mindreading proposed by simulation or theory theorists) and "critical in the development of a moral sense toward other feeling human beings" (179). As they argue persuasively in light of the results of various experiments, autistic children tend to view others from the outside without intuitively grasping their inner life. R. Peter Hobson does indeed deserve credit for being one of the researchers who has put the focus within the debate on social cognition and theory of mind on non-conceptual capacities that ground our interpersonal relations. It would interesting to see whether Hobson and Hobson's essay could produce a similar reorientation within the study of morality, where the focus has been on studying deficits in moral judgments. Moreover it would be interesting to devise further experiments to test whether and how deficits in interpersonal relations observed in people with autism as described in this essay manifest in irregularities of their moral judgments.

In "Empathy in Other Apes", Kristin Andrews and Lori Gruen seem interested in a similar reorientation of the debate by attempting to make us rethink the notions of empathy and morality and their application to chimpanzee societies. They point out that there is sufficient evidence for the claim that chimpanzees possess the capacities of cognitive empathy and perspective taking in that they are able to grasp the intentions and the visual perspective of other apes, even if they do not have a metacognitive grasp of another person's or ape's beliefs. They also suggest that chimpanzees can be understood as adhering to social norms of cooperation and fairness. However, such norms are best understood as being indexed to the quality of relationships, that is, cooperation is understood differently between a close kin and between strangers. They propose that the question of the morality among apes should not be approached presupposing Kantian notions of autonomy and pure reason but from perspectives that view the ethical realm as essentially situated and embodied.

All of this is indeed highly suggestive but also in need of much more detailed elaboration. For example, even Aristotelians who vehemently oppose the Kantian outlook on ethics and autonomy still seem to think that the ability for self-reflection and ability to tell stories about oneself is an essential characteristic of virtuous and ethical agents. One would also like to know which notion of social norms Andrews and Gruen are presupposing in their account. In the philosophy of social science, anthropology and sociology, for instance, there has been a long tradition of discussing this issue and one popular (but not necessarily uncontroversial) account analyzes social norms in terms of mutual expectations (and mutual knowledge of such expectations) of members of groups (Bicchieri 2006). One wonders, however, whether such understanding of norms could be easily applied to the animal kingdom. I must also admit I was a bit puzzled by their notion of entangled empathy and would have liked to have gotten a better grasp of how exactly it differs from notions of empathy otherwise appealed to in the literature and the contributions of this anthology.

In this respect, Douglas Hollan's illuminating contribution might be particularly helpful. Hollan develops his own account of empathy in light of notions already developed within the context of the theory of mind debate. He favors a notion of complex empathy distinguished from more basic empathic processes that emphasizes the cultural situatedness of empathy and the fact that it is always informed by awareness of cultural contexts. Moreover, from an ethnographic perspective the question of the importance of empathic knowledge for social cognition and morality is an open one. Indeed, as he shows in his own study of cultures from the Pacific area, the scope of empathy is always culturally modulated. Hollan points also to the ambivalence that certain Mayan or Inuit cultures have towards empathy, since they perceive it also as a means that can be misused. Empathy might, for instance, be used as an instrument to maintain class hierarchies rather than as an inspiration for human goodness. From that perspective, empathy appears to be a rather "fallible form of moral orientation" (248) and its moral benefits crucially depend on the manner in which it is conceptualized and talked about within particular societies. Accordingly, one might surmise that the close relation that philosophers from the 18th century onward postulate between morality and empathy might be a culturally constructed one; a construction guided by a certain conception of morality.

The anthology also contains a very practically oriented yet theoretically sophisticated discussion about "Psychological Altruism, Empathy, and Offender Rehabilitation." Focusing on practices of sexual offender rehabilitation, Tony Ward and Russil Durrant suggest that it is better to appeal to the broader notion of altruism failure (in light of Philipp Kitcher's conception of psychological altruism) rather than empathy failure. Ultimately, deficits in empathy are only one of the many causes of altruism failure manifested in sexual offenses. In order to be effective, offender rehabilitation needs to address all causes of such failure.

So far then, most of the authors are relatively restrained and cautious in ascertaining a link between empathy and morality. They certainly do not seem to view empathy as the sole foundation of morality or the sole cause for moral behavior, since they admit that the scope of our natural empathic abilities is limited. As is well known, empathy seems to be easier for us when we perceive the other person to be closer or similar to us on a variety of dimensions. Yet within various philosophical traditions there have certainly been suggestions of how to "correct" empathy in a manner that allows us to conceive of it as at the very heart of human morality. In this vein, in their essay, K. Richard Garrett and George Graham argue for the possibility of what they call "sufficient empathy" that would constitute the "empathic center of our moral lives" and human happiness. Taking their inspiration from Buddhist teachings they suggest that striving for sufficient empathy has ultimately to be understood as a lifelong pursuit of trying to free us from our psychological attachments. In light of the anthology's cover art (a photograph of a statue in a Buddhist temple in Shanghai), this is certainly a suggestion that deserves further exploration. In particular, it is to be asked how a Buddhist conception of compassion and empathy associated with a "no self" conception is compatible with a Western conception of empathy presupposing a strict separation of self and other.

Squarely within the Western tradition, Antti Kauppinen addresses some of the perceived "shortcomings" of empathy in his richly argued "Empathy, Emotion Regulation, and Moral Judgment" by utilizing the resources of traditional moral sentimentalism. Following Hume and particularly Adam Smith (whose Theory of Moral Sentiments has seen something of a philosophical Renaissance in recent years), Kauppinen argues that if we understand empathy as the basis for our causal judgments we have to conceive of it as being regulated by the ideal perspective. To morally judge another person -- and Kauppinen seems here to follow very closely Smith's account of merit and demerit -- requires empathizing with the reactive attitudes of the various persons relevantly involved and affected by the actions of a particular agent from such an ideal perspective. I strongly agree with Kauppinen that contemporary sentimentalists, regardless of whether they are defenders (i.e. Michael Slote 2010) or critics (i.e. Jesse Prinz) of the moral significance of empathy have indeed insufficiently appreciated this aspect of traditional sentimentalism. And Kauppinen correctly takes them to task for this oversight. Yet if I understand him correctly, he conceives of his account of moral judgment in this essay primarily as a causal explanatory thesis. After all, he refers to his account as Neo Classical Explanatory Sentimentalism and claims that it not merely explains the survival but also the origin of moral norms (118). I must admit I am a bit skeptical about this aspect of Kauppinen's position. First of all, I am not sure how one could in principle verify the causal efficacy of such an ideal perspective. Moreover, though maybe I am a bit cynical, looking at human history it seems to me that in ancient Greece, Athens was mostly concerned with Athens. So it is, has been and will be with countries like China, India, Germany and America.

Nevertheless, regardless of the causal efficacy of the empathy from the ideal perspective, reference to such regulated empathy might play a role in the normative justification of our moral judgment or in the explication of the normative status of such judgments. Kauppinen only briefly touches upon this issue. In my opinion, it is exactly for this reason that Adam Smith appealed to the impartial spectator perspective. The question of whether he has been successful in this regard certainly deserves further exploration. If we believe Christine Korsgaard (1996), to address such normative questions requires philosophical reflection on the structure and nature of the first person perspective within which normative questions arise and within which they are negotiated. No philosophical explication of the normative relevance of morality, however, can succeed if is inconsistent with what we know from the scientific third person perspective. It very much speaks in favor of this anthology that it provides us with a comprehensive survey about what we know about the relation between empathy and morality from the scientific third person perspective.


Batson, C.D. 2011. Altruism in Humans, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Bicchieri, C. 2006. The Grammar of Society: The Nature and Dynamics of Social Norms. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Hoffman, M. 2000. Empathy and Moral Development, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Korsgaard, C. 1996. The Sources of Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Prinz, J. 2011a. "Is Empathy Necessary for Morality?" in Empathy: Philosophical and Psychological Perspectives, ed. A. Coplan and P. Goldie, 211 -- 229. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Prinz, J. 2011b. "Against Empathy," The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 49 (Spindel Supplement): 214 -- 233.

Slote, M. 2010. Moral Sentimentalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.