Empiricism and Experience

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Anil Gupta, Empiricism and Experience, Oxford University Press, 2006, 288pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195189582.

Reviewed by Alan Millar, University of Stirling, UK


The aim of this book is to consider, in the light of two leading ideas, what contribution experience makes to knowledge. The first of these ideas, the Insight of Experience, is that 'experience is our principal epistemic authority and guide' (p. 3). The second, the Multiple Factorizability of Experience, is that any experience of the sort involved in perceiving the world 'can result from several different world-self combinations' (p. 6). For instance, the visual experience one gains from looking at a light green wall could have been obtained looking at a white wall on which a green light is shining. This raises the question, 'How can an experience contribute to our coming to know something, when the same experience could have resulted from a world-self combination that would not have enabled us to gain knowledge of that thing?'.

Gupta begins the enquiry by examining a Cartesian version of classical empiricism that incorporates sense-datum theory.  He sets out an argument for this kind of empiricism that relies on a number of assumptions. Existence of the Given has it that there is an element in each experience, the given, that 'makes a rational contribution to knowledge' (p. 19). Equivalence is the assumption that '[s]ubjectively identical experiences make identical epistemic contributions' (p. 22). Then there is an important assumption called Reliability according to which '[t]he given in an experience does not yield anything false or erroneous; in particular, it does not yield a false proposition' (p. 27). The final key assumption is Manifestation of the Given: '[t]he given in an experience must be manifested in that experience; that is, it must depend systematically upon the subjective character of the experience' (p. 30).

Gupta takes seriously, but does not endorse, the following argument. Suppose that we think of the given in experience as propositional. Then it would seem to be false that the relevant propositions include those that form the contents of perceptual judgements like 'There is a green wall before me'. Suppose that I have an experience such that it is as if I am looking at a wall that is green and that this occurs in a case in which I see the wall to be green. I might have had a subjectively identical experience in a case in which there was no green wall before me. By Equivalence, the epistemic contributions of those experiences would be the same. By Reliability the given in those experiences cannot be captured by the proposition, 'There is a green wall before me', since such a proposition would be false in the case in which no green wall is there. What kind of propositions do characterise the given? Manifestation of the Given has it that they must be propositions manifested in the experience in question. So, it is natural to suppose that the most basic judgements yielded by the experiences must pick out some object demonstratively and predicate something of that object. But then, by Equivalence and Reliability, they cannot be propositions of the form, 'That K is F' unless the sort K comprised items that would be present to one whether the experience was an ingredient of a case of perceiving, or, instead, was hallucinatory.  The sort K must comprise the sort of objects that have been called sense-data.

A natural first thought, faced with this Argument from the Propositional Given, is that Reliability is dubious or trivial. Under the assumption that the given is propositional, Reliability is dubious because it amounts to the dubious assumption that experiences furnish us only with truths.  But if we drop the assumption that the given is propositional we might well think that Reliability is trivially true: experience in and of itself presents nothing false or erroneous only because it does not present anything that it makes sense to evaluate in these terms. Gupta's strategy is to retain Reliability and Equivalence and to locate the mistake in the Argument from the Propositional Given in the assumption that the given is propositional and the related view that 'the logical function of experience is to provide us with truths about the world' (p. 55). His alternative view trades on the idea that, when I judge that p in response to an experience such that it is just as if p, the experience does not entitle me straight-off to judge that p. Rather my entitlement is hypothetical: if I am entitled to the (background) view I hold then I am entitled to judge that p. My view comprises 'my conceptions, concepts, and beliefs' (p. 76). In a case in which I am looking at a green wall and judge it to be green, the portion of my view that matters comprises the relevant concepts as well as beliefs to the effect that my eyes are functioning normally, that the conditions of light are apt for judging the wall to be green, and so forth. Gupta (pp. 79-80) takes this to show that the given in experience has the character of a function that takes views as inputs and yields classes of judgement as outputs. The given thus 'establishes rational linkages between views and perceptual judgements' (p. 81). One might wonder how this theory accommodates Manifestation of the Given. Gupta takes this to require only that the given should 'depend systematically upon the subjective character of the experience' (p. 30). He argues that this is met given a commonsense view since '[t]he perceptual judgements yielded by [this] view …  are plainly so dependent' (p. 85)'. But that is not quite the same as claiming that the given, under the present theory, depends systematically on the experience, since on that theory the given does not comprise perceptual judgements. The given is, rather, the function that takes us from views to classes of perceptual judgements. It is another matter whether the function depends systematically on the experience and does so in a way that captures the notion that the given is manifested in experience.

Gupta argues that Reliability is accommodated under his theory. The reliability of an experience consists in the fact that for any view v, if v is correct then the class of judgements that is the value of the relevant function, given v as argument, will comprise only true judgements. (See p. 86.) The question then is how the conditional requirements imposed by experiences can be turned into absolute requirements. (Gupta shifts without comment from talk of entitlements to talk of requirements and obligations.) To answer this, Gupta constructs a theory about the rational revision of views that is modelled on his and Belnap's work on interdependent definitions. A key concept is that of an epistemic revision sequence. Revision sequences are sequences of views resulting from the impact of the perceptual judgements that arise from a sequence of experiences. Imagine an ideally rational agent starting with a set of divergent views in the sense of pondering which such views to accept. Revision processes starting from each of these views, but prompted by the same sequence of experiences unfolding over time, would result in various of the initial views being discarded and others surviving. Some views surviving initial revisions will in turn be discarded while others survive, and so on. Omitting refinements, the thought is that if an ideally rational agent, starting out with a series of divergent views, were to undergo a course of experiences such that the revision sequences converge, then the agent would be under an absolute obligation to accept elements common to surviving views, beyond the point at which the revision sequences converge. (See p. 98.) Gupta acknowledges that this framework involves considerable idealization, but he devotes a chapter to removing the idealization and argues that the framework can form the basis of a reformed empiricism that avoids scepticism.

The problem of whether, and if so how, experiences contribute to knowledge and justified belief is central to epistemology. Despite its centrality, there is relatively little in epistemological tradition by way of sustained and systematic treatment. When we think of justifications for beliefs we naturally tend to think of them as being supplied by considerations that we accept. Whether, and if so how, experiences justify perceptual judgements is harder to make out. If I see that there is a robin in my garden it simply strikes me that there is. This is of course in response to what I see but I do not seem to rely on a reason in the form of some prior considerations that justifies thinking that a robin is there. It is no surprise that some theorists, notably Davidson, think it is a mistake to suppose that experiences have a rational role. Those who, like Gupta, adopt a philosophically traditional conception of experience try to work out how experiences can contribute to our being entitled to various beliefs about the world. Any plausible explanation will have to accommodate the fact that experiences never contribute to the justification of beliefs in the absence of some picture of the world -- what Gupta calls a view. This presents a problem if (a) we are justified in holding judgements arising out of experience only if we are entitled to hold to the relevant portion of our existing view, and yet (b) our entitlement to that portion of the view is problematic. It is a chief merit of this work that the problem is recognised and addressed in a systematic way that deserves serious evaluation. Nonetheless, the story as a whole still leaves it unclear what it is about experiences that enables them to contribute to the justification of beliefs. It is as if Gupta is saying to us, 'Granted that experiences have a rational role, here is a picture of how they interact with views to yield entitlements to belief and judgement'. Yet he does not in my view make it transparent to us how experiences can have such a role. Davidson's scepticism on this score arises from the thought that while experiences (conceived as states intrinsically devoid of thought-content) have a causal role in relation to beliefs, they are just not the sort of thing that can contribute to the justification of beliefs. Davidson's arguments to this effect may be wanting (as Gupta thinks, pp. 192-197). Yet, faced with Gupta's theory, Davidsonian theorists are unlikely to say, 'So that is how experiences can contribute to justification'. Their problem, after all, was not about the floating status of views but about the very idea that justification can derive from experiences.

Some epistemologists who address these matters invoke epistemic principles along the lines that if one has an experience just as if an F is present then one is justified in believing that an F is present in the absence of reasons not to take the experience at face value. Such a view suggests that a response to puzzlement about how experiences have a justificatory role might be, 'There is a plausible-looking epistemic principle linking experiences with beliefs along the foregoing lines and informing our epistemic appraisal of perceptual beliefs'. This approach is unsatisfying since it takes us little beyond a statement of the position that experiences have a justificatory role. If one were sceptical about this, one would be just as sceptical about whether there is such an epistemic principle. Gupta introduces an important refinement on the role of experiences: we are to think of experiences as giving us only conditional justifications of beliefs. But while the theory that incorporates this refinement interestingly addresses the problem of the floating status of initial views, it does not serve to make it transparent how experiences can rationally modify existing views.

In John McDowell's thinking, justification is clearly tied to reasons and reasons are conceived as propositionally constituted; a sub-class of experiences -- seeings-that, hearings-that, and so forth -- being factive, are held to furnish us with worldly facts. If the fact that p is taken in through such an experience then it can serve as a reason for believing other things. And since we can be apprised of the fact that we see that p, that fact itself, retained in memory, can serve as a reason that rationally sustains a continuing belief that p. This has the advantage of fairly directly reflecting commonsense thinking, but is liable to seem unsatisfying if unaccompanied by some story that illuminates how perceivings-that can play the epistemic role that they do and that explains our epistemic access to facts as to what we perceive to be so. It is, even so, an interesting competitor to Gupta's perspective. It is fuelled at least in part by the conviction that traditional thinking about experience places us at an epistemic distance from the world by making it impossible to make out how experiences can put us in cognitive contact with objects and facts. In a sense, Gupta sets out to provide just such an explanation. I doubt that what he says would persuade those sympathetic to McDowell's perspective that a conception of experience that treats factive states as on a par with their hallucinatory counterparts with respect to justification could yield an adequate explanation.

I have given only a brief indication of the main line of thought in this intriguing book. The analytical apparatus it develops is worked out in considerable detail and it is rich in engagements with key figures in the literature including Quine and Sellars. Though I am not persuaded by the central line of thought, it is not obvious how to construct a better theory on the matters that the book addresses.