Empty Ideas: A Critique of Analytic Philosophy

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Peter Unger, Empty Ideas: A Critique of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2014, 258pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199330812.

Reviewed by Katherine Hawley, University of St Andrews








Bad news: much of what you say as a philosopher is concretely empty. Yes, you, even if you do not work in metaphysics: Peter Unger's target is 'mainstream philosophy' of the past fifty years and, whilst he sets aside wholly normative claims, he makes plain their prospects are also dim (24). So a reviewer must establish what Unger means by 'concretely empty', before examining his reasons for thus classifying most of what philosophers-these-days say.

An idea or thought (something expressed by a sentence) is concretely empty iff it is concretely insubstantial, i.e., it doesn't say anything substantial about concrete reality. Such a thought 'doesn't delineate any ways for concreta to be from any other such ways' and is 'empty of import for, or as regards to, concrete reality' (6). Mathematical thoughts, likewise, are concretely empty. But mathematics is nevertheless worthwhile, for a couple of reasons: unlike philosophy, mathematics has never aspired to concrete substantiality, and moreover mathematics is synthetic, rather than analytic.

For Unger, conceptual truths and conceptual falsehoods are analytic, and they are 'conceptually empty' (so, very roughly, a thought is concretely empty iff it is not about concreta, but it is conceptually empty iff it is about concepts . . . ). He claims that many philosophical thoughts are concretely empty because they are conceptually empty.

Other philosophical claims are concretely substantial, but only because they are 'utterly parochial'. I infer from Unger's examples that these claims are typically, perhaps always, about the proper use of natural language words (or maybe about concepts). So it is concretely substantial yet utterly parochial to note that if someone says 'I believe there is a table in front of me', she may be correct even if there is no table in front of her, and to note that 'perceive' is used differently. But if we use these words (or concepts), rather than mention them, we easily tip over into conceptual emptiness. So the thought that someone can believe there is a table in front of her even if there is no table in front of her is an empty thought; likewise the thought that perception differs from belief in this regard. And these are the sort of empty thoughts which dominate mainstream philosophy.

All is not lost, however. There is an area of philosophy in which we find non-parochial yet concretely substantial thoughts: metaphysics of the most ambitious type. For example,

subjective idealism, (at least something like) a Berkeleian idea, delineates a certain way for concrete reality to be from certain other ways, saliently from any way that a materialist thesis would favour, with the former favouring ways where every concrete item is mental and non-material, and with the latter delineating things quite differently. (19)

Another example: the Lewisian thought that there are concrete entities not spatio-temporally related to one another. The category of concretely substantial thoughts also includes some (by no means all) of Unger's previously-published thoughts, e.g., his Interactionist Dualism (40), a.k.a. 'Dualist Interactionism' (41). As Unger makes clear, 'concretely substantial' does not mean 'empirically verifiable'. His call is not for us to abandon philosophy, but for us to get back to our concretely substantial roots.

There have been a number of recent critiques of contemporary metaphysics in particular (Callender 2011 is unusually illuminating). One type of critique begins with the thought that metaphysicians who deny, e.g., the everyday truth that there are tables are confusedly trying to speak a specially revelatory 'language of the seminar room'. Another type of critique begins with the allegedly culpable neglect of contemporary science by contemporary metaphysicians. These critiques can pull in different directions: the metaphysics we are likely to get from modern physics will not straightforwardly vindicate everyday truths. But in places, Unger seems to have some sympathy with each of these lines of attack, as applied to a wider swathe of philosophy.

Regarding the former, Unger allows that amongst the conceptually empty thoughts, some are correct, and others incorrect. (I don't think anything hangs on 'correct/incorrect' versus 'true/false'.) At several points, Unger engages in what looks like standard philosophical argumentation for or against a claim he regards as conceptually and concretely empty. For example, he advocates incompatibilism about free choice and determinism, argues that coincident statue and lump are two distinct objects, and seems to reject externalism about the content of language and thought. As I read him, Unger takes his views to be something like the commonsense position. This would fit with the idea that such debates concern our ordinary concepts free choice, statue, talking about and thinking about. Indeed, if you are happy to conceive of your philosophical method as conceptual analysis, or perhaps some kind of conceptual examination, then there isn't much in this book to disturb you (beyond the disparaging 'empty' coinage), although Unger will be saddened by your lack of ambition and your break with pre-positivist philosophical tradition.

Regarding the latter type of critique, Unger suggests that, 'during the next century or so', if there is to be any prospect of novel concretely substantial philosophical thoughts then

some of the most intelligent and philosophically talented young people must become serious scientists, contributing a great deal to the science in which they are involved and, what's more, contributing at least about as much to science as they contribute to philosophy. (239)

 (For now, approximately only Tim Maudlin has any hope of doing anything worthwhile.)

The key question is whether Unger manages to establish that the mainstream philosophical claims he discusses are merely conceptual truths (or falsehoods), in a sense which would entail that they lack substantial consequences for concrete reality, in a sense which would have negative consequences for our practice of philosophy. And the reviewer's key difficulty is that, beyond the 'delineation' idea, we get little detail about the notion of concrete (in)substantiality. After just a few lines of introduction, Unger writes 'As I expect, you'll have gotten the hang of what I'm after' (6).

And of course we can get a rough picture of what he has in mind. But if we are to engage properly, reflectively, fruitfully, if we are to compare Unger's views with other critiques of contemporary philosophy, then we need more than just a rough picture. Any precision has to be extrapolated from what Unger says, and cannot just be read off his pages. After all, plenty of the 'concretely empty thoughts' mentioned are at least prima facie about the concrete world (if they were literally about concepts, they'd be substantive but parochial), some of them are existence claims, and Unger acknowledges that some are true and some are false. What are the grounds for thinking they are merely analytic and lack 'import' for the concrete world? And do we need to be concerned about lack of import in this sense anyway? For Unger, mathematics has no import for concrete reality, presumably because its subject matter is abstract reality. But I'm guessing he accepts that mathematics often has practical utility, indeed more so than the speculative metaphysics which he regards as concretely substantive.

For what follows I'll engage with what struck me as some interesting ideas, but with little confidence that these are the ideas Unger wants us to engage with. In truth, I think he simply finds it obvious that most contemporary philosophy is nothing but sophistry and illusion, and so assumes that he only need show the reader some examples of such philosophy in order to persuade her to commit them to the flames.

In earlier work, Unger discusses and rejects the doctrine of Scientiphicalism, a kind of microphysicalism which can be spelt out in a range of different ways. In the present book, the doctrine is described as both 'orthodoxy' and 'concretely substantial' (32), so serves as an illustration of non-empty philosophical thought. And, although Unger doesn't quite say this, he can be read as making a deeper point, that mainstream philosophers' adherence to Scientiphicalism explains why so many of their other philosophical thoughts are concretely empty. Scientiphicalism entails that my microphysical duplicate (e.g., Swampme) does not differ in any significant way from me -- the differences between us are empty of import, one might say. So the thoughts that my duplicate cannot remember my college days, that Swampme cannot desire water when first created, and that my Twin Earth duplicate does not think about water -- all these thoughts are themselves empty of import, concretely empty, as Unger claims. And the negations of those thoughts are apparently equally empty.

If this really is Unger's point, then it's a very interesting one. (If I were pursuing it myself, I'd think about supervenience, reduction and elimination, and about more and less fundamental layers of reality -- maybe to delineate reality, to say something of import, something substantial, is to say something about what's fundamental? -- though I suspect my thoughts would then be empty by Unger's lights.) But at the same time it undermines the project of the book: the philosophical thoughts of semantic externalists, and of semantic internalists, are empty if Scientiphicalism is true. But the truth of Scientiphicalism is a concretely substantial issue. So whether Putnam's, Davidson's and Kripke's philosophical thoughts are concretely empty is a concretely substantial matter. And of course Unger thinks that Scientiphicalism is false. So perhaps I have misread the significance of the discussion of Scientiphicalism.

Unger's discussion of compatibilism and incompatibilism is also suggestive. Here are two concretely substantial claims: present events are fully determined by events which occurred long ago (Determinism); we choose amongst actually available options for action (Choice). Here is a concretely empty claim: if we choose our actions, then they are not fully determined by events long ago (Incompatibilism). According to Unger, 'Though it's concretely empty, philosophers do, and should, seriously consider this Incompatibilism . . . [which is an] interesting empty thought'  (31). (An interesting empty thought!) Is Incompatibilism empty because it is a conditional, not a categorical claim? If so, then emptiness may not be such a bad thing. After all, we can combine a substantive claim like Determinism with a conditional like Incompatibilism, to derive another substantive claim, i.e., the negation of Choice: thus Incompatibilism together with Determinism seem to delineate a way for concrete reality to be, even if we think that a conditional cannot have import for reality in isolation. Another group of concretely empty thoughts are also conditionals, of the form 'if there are particles arranged tablewise, then there's a table' (chapter 6). But not all empty thoughts are conditional, it seems, so conditionality can't be crucial.

Sometimes emptiness seems to reflect a kind of conceptual contingency: we use a certain concept, but could easily have used a nearby, somewhat different concept to express truths, so (?) the truths we express using our actual concept are not of great significance. This line can be read into chapter 5, where Unger discusses persistence conditions for material objects, and points out the great variety of persistence conditions and thus types of 'extraordinary' objects we might be concerned with, but in fact ignore. This reminded me of Ernest Sosa (2005) on conceptual and ontological relativity, and to some extent the work of Eli Hirsch and Alan Sidelle; but again this can't quite be right, since although Unger rightly praises both Hirsch and Sidelle, he unequivocally classes Sidelle's work as 'empty'.

At points, I wondered whether scepticism about the possibility of philosophical explanation -- and thus scepticism about inference to the best explanation in philosophy -- lay behind Unger's critique. After a lengthy quotation from Kit Fine on the importance of explaining sortal differences, he says, 'How might I help those enamored of such ideas abandon them?' (120, see also 125) And later: 'I see no reason to think that a more economical or more unified theory (of these concretely empty matters) is more likely to be correct.' (168). Those who take philosophical explanation more seriously might well think that explaining some feature of concrete reality was one way of having import for concrete reality.

Finally, Empty Ideas has many aspects the reader will experience as endearingly entertaining quirks, or as irritatingly privileged indiscipline, depending on mood. (UK readers may be reminded of Russell Brand.) The repeated references to the thoughts of leading philosophers (Lewis, Kripke, Davidson, Putnam, Fine) as 'empty' don't really grate, since Unger also takes much of his own earlier work -- and stretches of this very book -- to be empty. But the verbiage is wearying. For example, the well-known puzzle case about a statue and a piece of copper which coincide throughout their lifespans is introduced with a full page about the sculptor Art Garfinkel, Art's dealer who takes a 50% cut, the billionaire art collector in his penthouse apartment, and the nuclear explosion which triggers the denouement (110-11). Footnotes read like dictaphone notes-to-self: 'Already given in this chapter's first notes, I'll remind us of this book's publication details' (63 n22); 'on my desk now is a fairly new book [on this topic]' (57); 'Several sections of [this paper] are reprinted in the anthology used for metaphysics courses I've taught' (193); 'As all the world knows, Reasons and Persons was first published by Oxford University Press in 1984' (194).

Emails from NYU colleagues are quoted at length. Nineteen different Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy articles are mentioned, often merely as a vehicle for Unger's apparent bemusement at the sheer volume of 'empty' literature those articles cite. In the gobsmackingest footnote, this bemusement gets fatally entangled with the issue of gendered citation practices. Unger announces he 'will now do [his] bit to cite some very able women' (we're at page 124 n13), then discusses survey articles by two female authors. Concluding that 'it is not because almost all the most prominent mainstreamers are male philosophers that recent and current mainstream philosophy is so terribly replete with empty ideas' (125), the note finishes by listing, counting, and comparing citations to women within these two survey articles. As I expect, you'll have gotten the hang of what I'm after.


Callender, Craig (2011): 'Metaphysics and Philosophy of Science' The Continuum Companion to Philosophy of Science, edited by Steven French and Juha Saatsi, Continuum: 33-54.

Sosa, Ernest (2005): 'Ontological and Conceptual Relativity and the Self', Oxford Handbook of Metaphysics, edited by Michael J. Loux and Dean W. Zimmerman, Oxford University Press: 665-89.