Enactment, Politics, and Truth: Pauline Themes in Agamben, Badiou, and Heidegger

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Antonio Cimino, Enactment, Politics, and Truth: Pauline Themes in Agamben, Badiou, and Heidegger, Bloomsbury, 2018, 179pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781501341014.

Reviewed by Duane Armitage, The University of Scranton


This book presents an in-depth analysis of the various interpretations of St. Paul by Martin Heidegger, Giorgio Agamben, and Alain Badiou. Specifically, it focuses on each thinker's appropriation of Pauline pistis (faith, belief) as a segue into broader Postmodern critiques of metaphysics and of rationality. Cimino frames his book by posing the question: Why St. Paul? That is, what are the motivations for philosophers engaging and appropriating St. Paul as a philosopher? Cimino's answer (and thesis) is simply that St. Paul remains of interest to philosophers as a kind of antidote to traditional metaphysical and onto-theological frameworks, and, consequently, as a means to rethinking notions of politics, truth, and their interrelation. In my estimation, Cimino succeeds in developing his thesis and offers a much-needed voice to the philosophical conversation surrounding St. Paul in Continental circles. Moreover, his book is a model of clarity, not only regarding Continental appropriations of St. Paul, but in terms of Continental and Postmodern thinking writ large, as this philosophical approach is often guilty of being unnecessarily opaque.

The first chapter provides a careful survey of the appropriations of St. Paul by Heidegger, Agamben, and Badiou. Cimino shows how both Agamben and Badiou remain indebted to Heidegger's initial retrieval of St. Paul insofar as each thinker furthers Heidegger's project of finding in St. Paul a place for the pre-thematic or pre-theoretical. Cimino then focuses his attention on an exposition of what each thinker draws from St. Paul in terms of a conceptual framework. Whereas Heidegger's use of Pauline pistis, focused on enactment, ultimately culminates in the authenticity-structure of Sein und Zeit and the pre-thematic critique of Cartesianism, Agamben's and Badiou's highlight messianic expectation and the event, respectively. Cimino frames each exposition as a refutation of Nietzsche's anti-Pauline paradigm, largely developed in Nietzsche's The Anti-Christ, which argues that Paul, the real founder of Christianity proper, presents a meta-physical (Platonic) worldview borne out of ressentiment for this world. Instead, Cimino shows why Heidegger, Badiou, and Agamben find Nietzsche's thesis untenable, insofar as it is Pauline pistis which presents a novel way into a thinking beyond the dualistic and overly theoretical metaphysics of Platonism and into one of embodied ("factical") enactment. A particular strength of this chapter is Cimino's style, which is both concise and careful, as well as, again, extremely lucid. Continental thinking, particularly the thinking of Heidegger, is often rightly criticized for its obscurantism. Cimino's style almost wholly avoids this charge, as he rarely gets lost or bogged down in extraneous details or vague neologisms. His treatment of Agamben in this first chapter is worth particular mention. Indeed, I found this discussion much more helpful than Agamben's own text, as Cimino is able to draw out and complete some thoughts in Agamben which were merely inchoate, particularly with regard to Agamben's glosses on Romans 10:9 and the meaning of confession as veridiction. In sum, this chapter succeeds in showing precisely how and why Agamben, Heidegger, and Badiou present their cases for Pauline faith as an antidote to metaphysics.

The second chapter presents a much more detailed account of Heideggerian pistis, its historical background, and its subsequent reconfigurations, most notably in Heidegger's Sein und Zeit. Drawing from Derrida's remarks on Heidegger's existential analytic, a central focus in it concerns an overlooked term in Heidegger's philosophy, namely, attestation (Bezeugung), and how such attestation seems to converge and link to Heidegger's earlier use of Pauline pistis. Cimino's text is quite insightful in this regard, as he applies his hypothesis to and throughout some of the more difficult sections of Heidegger's Sein und Zeit. Again, he makes a powerful case for Heidegger's concept of attestation or "bearing witness" -- to authentic existential possibilities -- being fundamentally overlooked by previous Heidegger scholarship, particularly in its crucial role as a proper manifestation of conscience, and, perhaps most importantly, as a suitable phenomenological ground opposed to Cartesian-Husserlian foundationalism. Furthermore, Cimino's analysis of Pauline pistis leads him to the conclusion that pistis, for Heidegger, remains a fundamental attitude or comportment (Haltung) ultimately identifiable with Aristotle's notion of ethos from the Rhetoric, which Cimino, in turn, links rather cleverly (and credibly) to Agamben's notion of performativity and to Badiou's fidelity to the "event." Cimino's insights regarding pistis here lead him to conclude that such an analysis of pistis "allows one to substantially relativize some allegedly ultimate oppositions, especially the contrast between faith and reason, and to argue that pistis turns out to be an essential component of human rationality" (77). In other words, the discussion of pistis through the lens of these three thinkers permits Cimino to highlight some existential foundations of human experience that are often concealed by overly rationalist frameworks, foundations which, when properly thought, can and ought to reconfigure a new paradigm for philosophical discourse. His conclusions, although somewhat obvious to anyone familiar with Continental thinking, within this context, are not without their merit and insight.

In chapter three Cimino's concerns center on political developments that arise from Heidegger's, Agamben's, and Badiou's analyses of Paul, which he terms "political Paulinism," and of which he remains highly critical. Cimino argues that such political Paulinism develops in each thinker's reading precisely because each, following Paul, tends to favor pistis over nomos, or faith (and spirit) over law. According to Cimino, Heidegger's apolitical stance regarding human subjectivity eventuates in a radical political philosophy that remains concealed and unbeknown to Heidegger himself, insofar as it conceals the realm of the political altogether (one cannot help but think of Heidegger's political affiliation with Nazism here).

The Pauline privileging of spirit over law, which also appears, albeit in a less radical form, in the political thinking of Agamben and Badiou, is once again to blame. Each thinker's political philosophy ultimately fails, for Cimino, precisely because of each's inability to deal with the unresolved, but necessary, tension between their understanding of pistis vis-à-vis nomos (the latter of which remains essential to any political conceptual framework, which Cimino defines as the convergence of three essential characteristics: interest, conflict, and power). Nomos then remains essential to holding these three elements of the political together, whereas Heidegger, Agamben, and Badiou fail, according to Cimino, precisely because they cannot adequately formulate a philosophical paradigm that gives enough weight to the importance of nomos. Cimino's argument here is compelling largely because of its implications beyond the political. His point appears to be that any critique of the objective -- whether it be political law or even objective rationality (as in the Postmodern critique of metaphysics and onto-theology) -- must discover a method for objectivity's reincorporation or risk losing not only coherent practical application, but also intelligibility altogether (108-109). His analysis of the failure of each thinker to think "the political" properly leads Cimino to a deeper and more substantial critique of not only each thinker, but of Continental thinking in general. This critique concerns the anti-metaphysical assumption that largely unites most Continental and Postmodern thinking.

Chapter four follows the critique of the political privileging of pistis over nomos by going beyond the political to the metaphysical and onto-theological. Cimino's thesis here concerns critiquing a false assumption that remains latent in Heidegger's, Badiou's, and Agamben's criticisms of onto-theological metaphysics, namely the assumption that there remains no place in Plato or in Platonism for a proper understanding of pistis. Cimino shows how Agamben and Badiou, following Heidegger, find their philosophical impetus against the Western metaphysics of presence or of "sight" and its onto-theology in the writings of Paul. Indeed, Paul remains the source of the anti-metaphysical posture in Postmodernity. Cimino lays out a careful case that (1) the critique of Western metaphysics -- in all three thinkers -- has deep roots in St. Paul, and (2) that perhaps Continental thinkers ought not simply to assume that the Postmodern critique of metaphysics and onto-theology is a settled issue.

The heart of Cimino's analysis concerns not simply the three thinkers' appropriation of Paul, but, specifically, their appropriation of Pauline "truth" as opposed and contrasted with Platonic, metaphysical truth. The latter, according to the three thinkers, is contingent upon onto-theology and thus a correspondence (between idea and reality) model of truth. In contrast to this metaphysical correspondence theory, Cimino notes that each discovers in Paul a new paradigm for truth: for Heidegger, it is the existential-disclosive model, wherein truth, understood as unconcealment, is disclosed via a certain kind of authentic, existential comportment; for Badiou, truth is understood as a "procedure" which constitutes subjectivity, that is, truth is fidelity to an "event," which, in turn, grounds the subject in the subject's faithfulness to such event; and for Agamben, in a kind of synthesis of Badiou and Heidegger, truth is a "performative veridiction," wherein truth is performed by way of trust and truth-telling. Cimino remains critical (again, quite convincingly) of each of these models of truth due to their failure to delimit a sense of falsity or "untruth." That is, if truth is a performance, an existential disclosure, or fidelity to an event, what then constitutes falsity, untruth, or error? Cimino rightly notes, in my estimation, that such radical models of truth, if wholly divorced from anything rational or metaphysical, simply fail to distinguish truth from falsity, and thus must wholly equivocate the meaning of "truth" itself. In other words, each thinker's interpretation of Pauline pistis as truth, as subjective truth, appears to relegate truth entirely to the realm of the subjective, and thus to the relative.

In response to the subjectivism in Agamben, Heidegger, and Badiou, Cimino offers a rereading of the history of metaphysics through the lens of Plato's conception of pistis. He argues that although pistis is indeed on a lower level within the Platonic epistemological framework, nevertheless Plato presents pistis as a crucial focal point in his discussion of rationality, particularly vis-à-vis ancient sophistry. Plato's account allows for a proper distinction between truth and falsity. Indeed, this distinction is assigned to pistis as such (149). Moreover, truth, for Plato, is not so much an epistemic quality, but an ontological one; in other words, truth concerns reality as much as it does our "sight" of reality. Thus, the truth of pistis concerns the objects to which pistis relates. Truth concerns sensible objects, and thus the world of becoming and not of being; however, pistis nevertheless holds a truth function, as pistis still concerns itself with the kind of stability or stasis attributable only to being as such (159). In short, Cimino shows how rationality itself, rooted in the Platonic conception of mathematics, involves axiomatic presuppositions and thus is reliant to an extent upon pistis, insofar as pistis "believes in" those axioms. Just as mathematics, for Plato, needs philosophers to ground the authority of (i.e. give reasons for) its axioms, so also does rational discourse (logos) as a whole. Cimino concludes then that there lies a much more complex notion of pistis in Platonism (and in metaphysics in general), particularly as it relates to the operations of reason and truth, than 20th Century Continental thinkers -- at least Badiou, Heidegger, and Agamben -- have assumed.

I admit that I am biased towards Cimino's conclusions regarding the failure of Continental discourse to maintain discussions about truth that do not inevitably devolve into subjective relativism. Regardless, his case is anything but dismissive of these discussions. Most of the book is devoted to charitable readings of each thinker and the specific merits in each of their approaches. However, in essence, Cimino argues that mere acquiesce to the critique of metaphysics and the jettisoning of metaphysical notions of truth and reason is simply untenable in the long term, regardless of insights into pre-thematic experience that might follow initially. The strength of Cimino's book lies in his ability to hold in tension the insights gleaned from the retrieval of St. Paul by Heidegger, Badiou, and Agamben, while not discarding objective notions of truth and reason that require metaphysical grounding. Overall, Cimino's book is top-notch scholarship coupled with significant and enriching philosophical analysis, and is essential reading for anyone interested in not only Continental thinking regarding St. Paul, but also Continental thinking and its Postmodern elements in general.