Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy

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Cua, Antonio S. (ed.), Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, Routledge, 2003, 1020pp, $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415939135.

Reviewed by Manyul Im, California State University, Los Angeles


There are now several encyclopedias of philosophy in English. The Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy (henceforth, “the Encyclopedia”) is the only one of which I am aware whose sole subject is Chinese philosophy. There is another—the Companion Encyclopedia of Asian Philosophy, also from Routledge—that covers Chinese thought within a larger framework of Asian philosophy. Given the history of Chinese philosophy’s geographical, cultural, intellectual, and political influence on the world, an encyclopedia focusing on it is both a worthwhile and daunting project. In the end, I believe the volume before us is in important respects up to the task—particularly in the quality and high levels of scholarship that it contains. There are, however, editorial choices of varying eccentricity regarding content and organization that the user must traverse while taking advantage of the volume’s goods.

The Encyclopedia is intended, according to its brief preface, to be useful for university students and scholars but also to be “fully accessible to other interested readers” (p. xviii). However, readers should be aware that those who have no background or training in the Chinese language are not provided any informative tables or appendices that explain the Romanization or pronunciation of Chinese terms. Those who are trained will know the equivalence and pronunciation of ’Hsün Tzu’ and ’Xunzi’—but they are also less likely to consult an encyclopedic volume of Chinese philosophy, opting instead for more specialized books with less mass. The untrained would find it less confusing and much more empowering, I expect, if some explanation and comparison were provided of the two standard Romanization systems currently widely in use. In its defense, the Encyclopedia entries are consistent in their use of one system, Pinyin. There are also Wade-Giles equivalents given in parentheses for relatively commonly transliterated titles, names, and concepts. In addition, a useful map, chronology, glossary, and index are attached. So the omission of apparatus on Romanization and pronunciation is an oversight that I hope would be corrected in further editions.

Since it is an encyclopedic volume, one expects the entries to cover in some fair, comprehensive way the variety of figures, texts, and concepts in Chinese philosophy. In the Encyclopedia coverage is noticeably biased in favor of Confucian texts and figures. This perhaps reflects the interests of the primary editor as well as of the named board of editors, the significant majority of whom have specialized scholarly interests in Confucian texts. This bias is worn on the sleeve. The preface candidly informs the reader that those “who are especially interested in the history of Confucianism will find a fairly comprehensive treatment of principal figures …” (p. xvii). Twenty separate entries have titles beginning with “Confucianism:” and they by no means exhaust the entries on Confucian texts, concepts, and figures. No other topic receives this sort of editorial and titular largesse (though the fourteen entries whose titles begin with the words “Philosophy” or “Philosophy of” comes close—more on that organizational peculiarity later).

Aside from Confucianism, Daoist texts and concepts receive a relatively fair share of attention. Buddhism is somewhat under-represented, given its enormous influence in long periods of Chinese history. There are, on the other hand, a surprising number and variety of entries that center on Legalism in China under various concept, text, and figure headings. Legalism is a movement that is as difficult to define as it is to disentangle from a variety of ruling techniques that both Confucian and Daoist texts embrace. Indeed, attempts to define Legalism very quickly devolve into either arbitrary or controversial assumptions about the identity of these other schools—bringing in their wake larger questions about the aptness of “school” identity for many older texts at all. The entry titled “Legalism,” for example, lists six contrasts between Confucianism and Legalism. But notice the second contrast: “Turning to their historical and political heritage, most Confucians advocate ancient kings as models. The legalists, like Xunzi, advocate later or recent kings as models” (p. 362). That should raise an immediate question about the school identity for Xunzi, who is now considered Confucian but for long periods was considered unorthodox. Categorization by school identity is a difficult issue of retrospection practiced from the Han to present, and some figures seem constantly in flux. The practice of “school categorizing” could perhaps have received its own entry.

There are a few noticeably otiose entries. For example, the very first entry, titled “Aesthetics,” indulges throughout in a kind of cultural essentialism that seems unhelpful in an otherwise scholarly collection of entries. “It is no accident,” the author of the entry writes, “that all Chinese writers use musical and poetic intonations and tend toward painterly calligraphy. To write is to recite, to poeticize, to paint, to be a calligrapher … “ (p. 4). Such stipulation as generalization begs the question about who counts as a “Chinese” writer. It is just the sort of generalization the adherence to which in the past has encouraged quick dismissals of an important set of writings in the Warring States period, the Mozi. The fact that “Aesthetics” is the sole entry under the “A” section invites speculation that the entry’s inclusion had more to do with avoiding the aesthetic lurch of beginning an encyclopedia in English with a “B” entry. A separate entry on the Analects (Lunyu) of Confucius could have been there instead since the history, content, and uses of the Analects go beyond who Confucius was as an historical figure. But this volume, for some reason, eschews the inclusion of text titles as entries. There will be more on this later.

Also questionable as an editorial choice is the inclusion of a separate entry on Chiang Kai-shek, the political successor to Sun Yat-sen in Nationalist China. Sun also has his own entry but more deservedly so, given that he ideologically instituted national republicanism in a region with a dominant imperial past. Chiang’s achievement, on the other hand, is that he led the Nationalist government of China until its ouster by Chinese communists in 1949. Whatever prominence Chiang may have as a political figure—particularly in the disputes over identity of the legitimate government of China in the twentieth century—the extent of his inclusion in an encyclopedia of Chinese philosophy probably should stop at passing mention in a section on Sun Yat-sen’s political legacy. In all likelihood the entry on Chiang is influenced by editorial aversion to any semblance of political bias in the aforementioned and ongoing dispute of legitimate Chinese government. For of course Mao Zedong, who led the communist government that replaced the Nationalists, has his own entry in the Encyclopedia. But that seems far more justified since Mao’s fascinating transformation of Marxism into a form palatable within the Chinese intellectual milieu is worth exploration—and the author of that entry makes admirably thorough work of it.

Lest it seem that there can only be complaints about the Encyclopedia it is worth singling out a couple of entries that are more representative of the high utility of many entries. The entry titled “Quanli (Ch’üan-li): Rights” deserves attention for its concise yet comprehensive discussion. The piece is a model of efficiency, spanning in informative leaps not only the development of the concept of “rights” in China, but also the important theoretical and historical aspects of the concept in the West with which it contrasts. We learn, among other things, that an important element in the development of the concept in China was the peculiar choice of translation by a nineteenth century missionary. “W. A. P. Martin used quanli as a compound term to translate ’rights,’“ the author points out, even though historically in Confucian commentaries that compound means “power and profit,” carrying with it negative connotations (p. 628). Subsequently, nineteenth and twentieth century Chinese intellectuals were able to use that compound “as part of an effort to rethink the Confucian ethical and political heritage” (p. 629), hence engaging in the tricky task of both furthering a tradition while being critical of it. Likewise, the entry titled “Ritualism” traces through Chinese history a strand of Confucian tradition that is arguably the most definitive of it if anything is. The author’s grasp of the influence of early religious aspects of ritual on its development as the foundation for ethical thought and practice in Confucianism helps very much to illuminate the history of Confucian tradition. We discover that in various ways the rise and fall of adherence to ritualism is a very useful paradigm by which to gauge the strength of Confucianism in a period of Chinese history. Like the other entries in the Encyclopedia, there is a highly useful bibliography attached to each of these entries.

Quite possibly, editing an encyclopedia is an even more thankless task than reviewing one. So we should be generous in giving the editor credit for having amassed a wealth of informative essays by excellent scholars. With that in mind, there are two points about organization of the entries that I must discuss for the aid of the reader.

The interested reader will discover that there is no separate entry titled “The Yijing (. Ching),” a text that has extraordinary influence among Chinese thinkers of all stripes. Instead, the text is discussed extensively in an entry called “Philosophy of Change.” In fact this is representative of the Encyclopedia; as I have mentioned, it avoids all use of Chinese text titles as entries. Some notice and/or explanation of this editorial choice would have enhanced the preface. Usually the reader can search for a text by looking up the name of the figure traditionally associated with it. That is easiest, of course, with eponymous texts. But where there is no such associated figure, it is unclear that there is a single organizing principle available for use in locating the text through browsing. This is not prohibitive if the reader is interested in a particular text, since the index will be of use in locating relevant discussions. It is however, cumbersome.

The reader should also be aware that there is nothing special, relative to other entries, in the numerous entries beginning with “Philosophy of”. Remove those words from the beginning of each entry title and you have the topic that the piece is about vis-à-vis Chinese philosophy. The addition of “Philosophy of” to these entry titles is distracting, and the reason why these and not others carry the appendage is opaque. In general, the utility of the volume could be enhanced with more prefatory information about editing choices. Once those choices were clear, so too would be the path to the highly satisfying and informative entries.