Ending Life: Ethics and the Way We Die

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Margaret Pabst Battin, Ending Life: Ethics and the Way We Die, Oxford University Press, 2005, 352pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195140273.

Reviewed by Nafsika Athanassoulis, University of Leeds


Readers familiar with Battin's earlier work will welcome this sequel to her previous volume The Least Worst Death (1994). In this collection of essays Battin continues a lifelong deliberation on issues surrounding the way we die. The main focus of the book is on physician-assisted suicide, but this topic itself is intelligently and sensitively approached from a variety of perspectives, ranging from the typically analytical philosophical approach one would expect to see in such a book, to accounts of historical, sociological, and cultural influences on the topic. At the same time Battin interprets her remit of end-of-life issues with imagination to include often ignored subjects such as suicide bombing, high-risk religious practices, and global issues.

It would be a disservice to this book to begin without drawing attention to the wealth of approaches Battin uses to examine her subject. Amongst the diverse essays comprising this volume one finds rigorous, well-defended philosophical accounts of Battin's position. At the same time the author is acutely aware of the sensitive nature of her chosen topic and the reader shares in her subtle approach when reading the two fictional chapters included in the collection. Robeck, a fictional account of a couple's determination to shape the timing and character of their deaths, and Terminal Procedure, an account of the emotional impact of experimenting on animals, capture a side of end-of-life issues which can sometimes get lost in academic discussions. That Battin chooses to include these fictional pieces alongside her more conventional contributions says something about her general approach to this topic. The author is genuinely appreciative of the difficulties of discussing these issues and comes across as honestly willing to consider other points of view. At the same time, the philosophical contributions to the collection lack nothing in the robustness and persuasiveness one would expect them to exhibit to merit consideration as serious pieces of theoretical work.

Not only does Battin successfully combine academic pieces with fiction, but she also shows a remarkable depth of knowledge of the historical, cultural, social and at times legal influences which have shaped this debate. The reader gets the impression that this book is the result of serious and meticulous scholarly research on all aspects of these really difficult questions. Battin comes across as eloquently familiar with scientific developments, statistical studies and the realities involved in practicing the various solutions proposed. For example, Collecting the Primary Texts: Sources on the Ethics of Suicide is an essay outlining the shape of a research programme into our religious and cultural attitudes towards suicide. The outline of this project seems so interesting I am led to wonder whether Battin has had the chance to take this idea further, even though its remit is primarily historical and archival and my background is in philosophy. This is a good example of how Battin's approach is likely to inspire and motivate others to further engage with these issues. These historical and sociological observations are put to good use, sometimes explaining the basis of philosophical arguments and the different understandings we may have of the concepts involved. A good example is Battin's observations regarding cross-cultural differences in our views on euthanasia; "The Dutch see the Americans as much further out on the slippery slope than they are because Americans have already become accustomed to second-party choices that result in death for other people. Issues involving second-party choices are painful to the Dutch in a way that they are not to Americans precisely because voluntariness is so central in the Dutch understanding of choices about dying" (58). The slippery-slope argument in this case is applied from both perspectives and we need to examine the views of each nation to understand what counts as acceptable practice and what counts as a worrying slide into objectionable practices.

Given the breadth and ambition of this collection it would be impossible to cover all essays in a short review, so instead I will focus on a couple of pieces. The first piece I would like to draw attention to is the very first one, Euthanasia and Physician-Assisted Suicide, simply because it is a most eloquent, detailed but succinct summary of the main arguments in this difficult area. The piece is all the more remarkable because of the brief but in-depth account of the main positions which shows a real appreciation of the force of the various arguments and how they are interconnected. It is probably the best summary of the various arguments and taxonomy of how these ideas relate to each other currently available.

Battin's philosophical credentials are also on display in this collection. In Is a Physician Ever Obligated to Help a Patient Die?, she argues for a physician's duty to assist patients in dying. Battin bases her argument on two principles; the right to self-determination is a familiar account of patient autonomy but it is coupled with the idea of mercy. Generally, appeals to the role of medicine have been used to argue that it is incompatible with the role of medicine for doctors to be asked to assist in dying. However, Battin sees helping patients die without suffering and in dignity as fundamental to the role of medicine. This does not mean that she underestimates the role of palliative care. Battin is well informed on such advances and indeed her emphasis on self-determination must include offering the patient all palliative care options as well as the choice in assistance to die. Battin is also sensitive to slippery-slope objections, but rightly points out that there are safeguards to avoid slides and in any case appeals to a speculative case about potential risk are not sufficient to trump the moral principles of self-determination and mercy. So that "… the stronger the patient's current wish for a physician-assisted death (this is the self-determination axis) and the greater the patient's experience of unrelievable pain and suffering in the process of dying (this is the mercy axis), the stronger the dual basis of the patient's right and hence the stronger the physician's correlative obligation to provide the patient with assistance in dying" (98-9). Not only do physicians have a duty to assist in dying but those doctors who seek to avoid this decision by not discussing this option with their patients early on or not disclosing their conscientious objections at an early stage when other options are available, may find themselves more obligated to respect patient self-determination and act in accordance with mercy.

The last paper I want to draw attention to is High-Risk Religion: Informed Consent in Faith Healing, Serpent Handling and Refusing Medical Treatment. The reason I am particularly interested in this paper is Battin's choice of topic. A false sense of what is expected of us if we are to be tolerant of other people's values may lead us to simply accept without question the edicts of another person's religion and the demands or restrictions they may place on him. Battin refuses to come to such hasty conclusions and, displaying what seems to be a characteristic ability to be well informed, examines the conditions under which certain religions influence the decision-making processes of their followers. She is interested in decisions made mainly in health care settings based on religious grounds which carry a high risk of harm or even death for the believer. Amongst the cases she discusses are Jehovah's Witnesses who refuse blood transfusions, Christian Scientists who shun conventional medicine in favour of faith healing, the Faith Assembly which prohibits conventional medical assistance and the Holiness Church which enjoins its members to handle venomous snakes. Battin undertakes a detailed analysis of the terms under which these decisions are made since choices should be respected but only if the conditions of autonomy have been fulfilled. She uncovers a number of influences which may invalidate the believers' consent including:

-- coercion in the form of negative repercussions for those who refuse to take the risk;

-- impairing decision-making faculties by promoting highly charged, emotional states in their believers;

-- influencing the assessment of probabilities by providing incomplete, biased or unverified data as truth;

-- altering the evaluation of outcomes in accordance with values outside the range of rationally defensible values.

Thus "[t]he Faith Assembly, at least on some occasions, coerces its members into refusing medical treatment. The Holiness serpent-handling groups encourage making potentially fatal decisions about handling snakes under extreme emotional impairment, calling that condition an anointment for taking the risk. Christian Science provides selective, anecdotal information only, without base or failure rates, in a way that is inevitably deceptive in influencing high-risk choice" (215). If priests, like all professionals, have a fiduciary obligation to behave in a trustworthy manner and promote their followers' interests then we must require that "… the priest or the preacher not treat those who come as prey, even in the most subtle ways, or use them either for self-interested ends or other institutional goals …" (216-7). This conclusion gives her grounds for arguing that, at least in some cases, decisions to risk one's life for religious reasons are not made in accordance with the requirements for valid consent.

Margaret Thatcher once described consensus as "the process of abandoning all beliefs, principles, values and policies. So it is something in which no one believes and to which no one objects". Battin's thoughtful, well-rounded, sensitive approach gives me hope that Thatcher was wrong, that it is possible to arrive at answers when considering difficult end-of-life issues and that Battin is right in aiming to look for resolution in this polarised debate.