Enduring Injustice

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Jeff Spinner-Halev, Enduring Injustice, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 246pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107603073.

Reviewed by Catherine Lu, McGill University


Why should past injustices matter today? Given the 'ubiquity of injustice' (39), which ones matter and require us to do something in response? How does focusing on the history of an injustice help us to think about our duties of justice today? Jeff Spinner-Halev has written a theoretically and empirically rich, serious and nuanced book to help guide our thinking about these thorny questions, especially as they pertain to contemporary liberal democracies. Instead of focusing on a duty to rectify injustices of the distant past, he shifts our attention to thinking about the responsibility of contemporary agents for repairing enduring injustices. Such injustices are past radical injustices that have lasted for at least two generations, defy standard liberal remedies for injustice, and are likely to continue without some policy or attitudinal change. Radical injustices can come in a variety of forms, including exile and dispossession of land, cultural dispossession, and living under pervasive discrimination or terror. Such injustices are radical in the sense that those who experience them have subsequent great difficulties feeling 'at home in the world' (8). Those who suffer enduring injustice feel disconnected from the processes or people that rule their lives, they feel disempowered to bring about changes that are responsive to their interests and needs, and their conceptual universe is displaced so that the world feels like a foreign place without meaning.

Spinner-Halev's concept of radical injustice identifies a category of injustices, wrongs and harms that disrupts the narrative arc of liberal progress. Liberalism as a theory contains the resources for overcoming many kinds of social and political injustices. Classical liberalism's solution to injustice is to guarantee individual rights, limited and accountable government, rule of law, equal citizenship, and equality of opportunity. Liberal egalitarianism has the progressive aim of ensuring equal respect and concern of all persons in the society. According to Spinner-Halev, however, liberalism has limitations as a progressive political philosophy, and liberal justice cannot adequately deal with radical injustices, which is one reason why such injustices become enduring ones. Liberalism's focus on individual rights, for example, makes it difficult to make sense of the collective narratives and histories of groups that suffer enduring justice. Liberal theories of justice that focus on distributive justice have a hard time accommodating the idea of sacred land. Groups suffering from enduring injustice 'have not mostly or fully been part of the progress of the Western world over the last two or three centuries' (42).

Since enduring injustices are not readily remedied by liberal justice, Spinner-Halev encourages acknowledgement that effective efforts to repair such injustices may require temporary detours from liberal justice. In addition, overcoming some enduring injustices may even require permanent departures from liberalism. Acknowledging the possibility that some injustices cannot be fixed or terminated by a thorough implementation of liberal measures leads to a 'tragic liberalism', more mindful of its own limits and therefore less confident about the eventual triumph of liberalism, more capable of confronting hard choices and trade-offs between different values, and more open-ended about the future (159).

A great strength of this book is its account of the serious challenges confronting theories of reparations or rectificatory justice. Spinner-Halev shows that given finite or scarce resources, theories of reparations that focus on one group's claims based on historical injustice are not generalizable without creating conflicts with contemporary distributive justice (31). He also makes a forceful challenge against a typical argument in the rectificatory justice literature that bases contemporary rectificatory duties on the idea that contemporary agents have benefited from past injustices. Spinner-Halev points out that economic gains or losses cannot capture all enduring injustices that require a contemporary response, and asks

If African American slaves were found to have contributed little to the overall American economy, would that make slavery any less just? . . . Why should repairing the injustice turn on whether the perpetrator gained economically from the injustice? (81)

In another well-argued chapter, Spinner-Halev criticizes the contemporary practice of governments to apologize for past wrongs, highlighting the difficulties that attend the effort to transpose the functions of individual apologies to groups and states. In addition to raising thorny questions about whether a political community can take responsibility and 'apologize for deeds that happened decades ago by and to people who are dead' (106), government apologies for historical injustices are rarely transformative or substantively capable of overcoming enduring injustices, absent other attitudinal and policy changes. Since the resolution of many enduring injustices is uncertain and will entail hard choices, trade-offs, compromise and negotiation, Spinner-Halev recommends acknowledgement of historical injustices that have become enduring injustice, in order to start a polity on a process of engagement with the affected communities that is both hopeful of overcoming enduring injustice but also aware of the difficulties of solving such injustices.

Spinner-Halev forwards the concept of enduring injustice as a way to identify which past injustices should be of political concern and which historically injured groups merit some kind of political response today. The concept of enduring injustice includes three components: (1) the group suffering an enduring injustice must have a collective narrative that dominates other narratives; (2) the group must have been a victim of past injustice; and (3) the past injustice persists and its effects are likely to continue, despite liberal reforms, indicating the inadequacy of liberal justice as a remedy (63).

Significantly, according to Spinner-Halev, 'To the extent that some groups do not have collective narratives, they cannot suffer an enduring injustice' (61). Groups such as African and Native Americans suffer enduring injustice, but other kinds of social groups or categories of persons, such as women and workers, do not. To support his claim that gender injustices do not properly constitute enduring injustices, Spinner-Halev argues that the identity of women intersects with other identities such as ethnicity, race and nationality, and these latter identities typically trump gender as a social category of identity. In addition, women have made more economic progress than African and Native Americans, so 'there is hope that the story of progress for women still holds' (63). With respect to class, he argues that workers do not clearly see themselves as 'an intergenerational group with a collective narrative,' and class-based injustice does not qualify as enduring injustice because class lines are 'often permeable' (63).

Spinner-Halev's account of enduring injustice is meant to explain why today, some groups (such as African and Native Americans) are generally considered victims of historical injustice who still need some form of redress, while other groups (such as women and workers) are generally not thought to constitute the kind of group to whom redress is owed for past injustices. I do not believe it is Spinner-Halev's intention to deny that within contemporary liberal democracies, there are still class- and gender-based injustices, and that such structural injustices have deep historical roots. However, in order to defend his exclusion of women and workers from the concept of enduring injustice, he needs to tell a more positive and hopeful story about the possibility of liberalism to remedy such structurally-based injustices. But surely, just as liberalism was tied to colonial and imperial enterprises (79), it has also been complicit in the oppression wrought by patriarchy and global capitalism. It is not clear why one should have more faith that liberal justice can remedy structural injustices produced by patriarchy and capitalism, but not have a similar faith with respect to structural injustices produced by colonialism and imperialism.

In contrast to Spinner-Halev's enduring injustice, Iris Marion Young's account of structural injustice, for example, is pertinent for a variety of social groups or categories of people who suffer structural disadvantages that have an impact on their capacity to lead fulfilling lives. Structural injustices, like enduring injustices, are contemporary injustices perpetuated and experienced by contemporary agents, but according to Young, it 'is not possible to tell this story of the production and reproduction of structures without reference to the past.'[1] Spinner-Halev's account of enduring injustice seems to be a subset of Young's structural injustices, but it is not clear why we should limit the concept of enduring injustice to that suffered by a particular kind of social group. If what unites cases of enduring injustice is a 'failure of liberalism' (64), then the persistence of gender and class discrimination, marginalization and oppression in contemporary liberal societies could qualify as enduring injustices.

Spinner-Halev notes that enduring injustices are distinct in presenting liberal states with a problem of legitimacy and mistrust. For example, 'The history of the relationship between Western governments and indigenous peoples puts the justice of the authority of those governments into question' (78). While this argument is especially convincing in the case of indigenous peoples who were forcibly colonized and dispossessed of their culture and sacred lands, it is probable that other historically and persistently disadvantaged or mistreated social groups may also have similar problems with the liberal state. Women may share with indigenous peoples a mistrust of the liberal state in so far as it is patriarchal. Similarly, the poor may not consider the liberal welfare state to be a sufficient remedy for the alienating and exploitative injustices of the capitalist state and global order.

The inclusion or exclusion of gender- and class-based injustices from Spinner-Halev's concept of enduring injustice is important because of the next step in his argument, which is that the appropriate response of contemporary societies to enduring injustices is acknowledgement and 'real understanding of the injustice', along with good faith efforts to overcome them (87). Spinner-Halev's arguments here about the importance of acknowledgement in supporting ongoing political efforts to overcome enduring injustices are also useful and pertinent to showing how the stalled progress of liberal societies in addressing a variety of unacknowledged structural injustices may be overcome. I am not trying to argue that there is nothing unique or distinct about some of the kinds of injustices that can be suffered by groups that have intergenerational collective narratives. But including gender- and class-based oppression and inequities in the concept of enduring injustice may also help to expose further the complexity of many enduring injustices, especially differentiation in victimization within historically mistreated communities.

The problem of internal injustice within communities that suffer enduring injustice arises in Chapter 6, when Spinner-Halev confronts the challenges raised by groups, such as indigenous peoples or minority religious groups, that claim autonomy as a remedy for the injustice of forcible incorporation or religious discrimination in liberal democratic societies. In particular, he aims to provide some guidance on how liberal democracies can work to overcome the enduring injustice affecting these communities without entrenching internal injustice within them (164). Although the tainted legitimacy of the dominant political community's institutions leads to recognizing the partial autonomy of such communities, Spinner-Halev argues that the legitimacy of the autonomous community's governance structure requires democratically accountable representatives and democratic procedures for collective decision making. Insisting on democratic representation and procedures does not guarantee the validation of a full set of liberal rights, egalitarianism or gender equality, but if the liberal state ensures background conditions that empower all women, then the democratic requirement for autonomous governance can work to promote internal reforms (171-174). Incorporating gender- and class-based structural injustice into his account of enduring injustice might have strengthened these arguments, as it would be clear that there are a variety of intersecting enduring injustices, all of which require contemporary political responses, although addressing them in an integrated fashion will require different types and levels of remedies and initiatives.

For liberal theorists, this book contains many hard and uncomfortable acknowledgements, especially about the moral failures and limits of liberalism and liberal justice in the production and overcoming of enduring injustices. Intellectually honest and humble, Spinner-Halev helps to reorient our engagement with past injustices, and provides an enduring contribution to constructing a more hopeful, if not assuredly progressive, liberal response to enduring injustice.

[1] Iris Marion Young, Responsibility for Justice (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011), 185.