Engagement and Metaphysical Dissatisfaction: Modality and Value

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Barry Stroud, Engagement and Metaphysical Dissatisfaction: Modality and Value, Oxford University Press, 2011, 163pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199764969.

Reviewed by Drew Khlentzos, University of New England, Australia


Barry Stroud argues that puzzles about the metaphysical status of values, modality and causation are of a particularly recalcitrant kind: on the one hand, we cannot make sense of the world without believing these properties exist and thus can know that attempts to unmask them as illusory or as mental constructions must fail. On the other hand, we have no satisfying positive reason to believe in their mind-independent reality. He writes:

A positive metaphysical verdict could at least seem to offer what a negative verdict promised but could not deliver: a detached, impartial and consistently acceptable account of the relation between the beliefs in question and the independent reality they are about. (p. 158).

The failure of negative evaluations does not by itself support any such positive verdict. Indeed, "if modal and evaluative notions are felt to be metaphysically problematic . . . then even a positive verdict would seem to offer no prospect of increasing our understanding." (p. 158) Stroud presents a carefully argued, lucid and scholarly defence of his thesis, applying it first to causation, then to necessity and finally to value. Kantian themes and problems pervade this book, so it is no surprise to find Hume and his latter-day followers as the chosen protagonists for the deflationary accounts of modality and value Stroud sets out to oppose.

The chapter on causation reviews Hume's projectivist account and its recent development by quasi-realists who, in defiance of their leader, unabashedly recite the realist creed of mind-independent causal connections between events or objects in the world whilst opining in their hearts that "once the mind has 'spread itself on the world' . . . it also regards itself as reading things off the world it has projected." As the things 'read off' the world include the very 'mind-independent' causal connections they avow, quasi-realism appears Moore-paradoxical. Stroud does a good job of exposing further problems with it.

In his chapter on modality Stroud argues that it is very hard to ground necessity in the way the mind-independent world is simply because this would require the world to include "not only everything that is in fact so but also everything that must be so as well" (p. 61). On this basis he rejects various accounts of necessity that seek to reduce the notion to ordinary non-modal facts of some sort.

En route to concluding that, as for causation and modality, it is the "combination of the irreducibility, the indispensability and the pervasiveness" of values that "defeats the attempt to reach a completely general negative metaphysical verdict about them" (p. 124), Stroud engages with Alan Gibbard's sophisticated account of normativity. Gibbard argues that whilst there are normative truths in the minimalist sense of 'truth', there are no normative facts in a more robust sense of 'fact': the world contains no robust normative properties, and in their stead there are just creatures who traffic in normative concepts irreducible to any naturalistic ersatzes. Normative judgments express certain of our preferences.

The book's Kantian problematic does have its down side. Firstly, it ignores some important contemporary challenges to the Kantian perspective. Thus there is no discussion of Saul Kripke's seminal work on necessity even though the latter's careful disentangling of the notions Kant had confounded, the necessary and the a priori, is of fundamental importance to both the metaphysics and the epistemology of modality.

Another problem resulting from its Kantian framing is that the question of the reality of value, cause and modality seamlessly merges into the quite distinct one of whether we can make sense of the world without believing in these properties. Whilst Stroud rightly argues conceptual indispensability is no guide to reality, it's doubtful he'd allow that modality, cause and value could be real even though conceptually dispensable.

Could metaphysical reality and conceptual dispensability be co-tenable? In all his discussions of the queerness of objective moral properties Mackie never gives the impression he is in fact (albeit unwittingly) describing a wholly alien world, let alone a conceptually incoherent one. We can understand what the world would have to be like if it were to lack objective values: it would be a Mackie world. We are moral realists to the extent we think the balance of evidence favours the reality of objective values. From this perspective there is no difference as regards their reality between morals and muons.

This is pretty clearly not Stroud's view of things. Stroud contends the indispensability of modality, value and causation gives us no reason to believe the world contains these properties. The natural upshot of this thesis is a kind of Pyrrhonian scepticism: any argument for the illusory status of modality, value or causation can be neutralized but no positive argument for their mind-independent existence can be found. Hence, we should withhold assent from theses asserting the world contains causal or modal relations or objective moral values. That conclusion would have been congenial to the Pyrrhonian David Hume: whilst continuing to talk with the vulgar about the cause of Arctic ice thaws or the consequences of overfishing, we must prescind from any metaphysical pronouncements on the reality or nature of causation.

Yet Stroud is no Pyrrhonist. The puzzle is why. Perhaps, unlike the Pyrrhonist, Stroud thinks we do have knowledge of modality, causation and value but only in the right contexts? Thus, we can know with the folk that no proposition can be true and false, that torture is immoral and that smoking can cause cancer, but we lose this knowledge once we enter the metaphysics classroom. It is not that the agnosticism induced in the latter context trumps the credulity that rules the former, however; it's that what one knows in the folk context one does not know in the metaphysical context. Once we leave the metaphysics classroom, we recover our knowledge of causes in conversation with uncomplicated people who take the notion of cause for granted.

Stroud gives no indication he is sympathetic to contextualism about our knowledge of metaphysical truths. To the contrary, he appears to assume that if we know the world contains values, causation or modality at all we know this in any context. More likely, Stroud is a reluctant primitivist about the troublesome metaphysical notions he discusses. We do know that causation, value and modality are real but we can tender no positive account of how we know this. The best we can do is reject sceptical and deflationary assessments of this knowledge as internally incoherent. Yet even this much knowledge seems to go beyond Stroud's brief: we are, after all, not permitted to infer values are real just because our evaluative judgments are indispensable.

We can be confident only that Stroud opposes reductions of value, necessity or cause. So at the very least his 'Indispensability' Thesis is supposed to ensure Reductionist theories of these domains must fail. If we cannot help thinking of our world as containing moral values as well as modal and causal relations, we must represent these items as irreducible or at the very least ineliminable. Hence perhaps his settled thought is that even if it were true that values, for example, were certain sorts of preferences it would never be rational for us to accept this.

If this is his thesis it faces some serious challenges. Quine is an eliminativist about necessity and all other intensional notions: the truths we deem necessary are simply those closest to the centre of our web of belief, ones we cannot imagine giving up in the course of experience. There is no genuine property of metaphysical or logical necessity, according to Quine: necessity is simply a measure of conceptual centrality. Since to theorize about anything requires us to take some truths for granted, thinking about necessity requires this also. So there will be certain core truths implicated in a Quinean elimination of necessity, some of which may well be perceived as necessary. Whence, the perceived indispensability of necessity on Quine's view is perfectly consistent with its eliminability.

Stroud's arguments about the indispensability of necessity to my mind make Quinean modal eliminativism appear unpalatable. Still, even if eliminativism about modality is dubious, plausible reductive accounts of it exist. Timothy Williamson suggests one; David Lewis, most famously, another.

Williamson argues that our beliefs about what is necessary or possible are grounded in everyday counterfactual reasoning: to say that it is necessarily true that there is no greatest prime number is to say that if there were a greatest prime number then pigs could fly (for example) and to believe that it is possible spacetime is discrete is to believe that it is not the case that if spacetime were discrete pigs could fly. Moreover, since anyone who can deduce an absurdity from the supposition that there is a greatest prime can thereby come to know it is necessary there is no greatest prime, metaphysical modality is no longer mysterious: we can not only say what it is but also how we come to know about it. Stroud's thesis that we have no positive metaphysical ground for asserting modality exists is false if Williamson is right.

David Lewis would not have resisted Williamson's analysis of modality in terms of counterfactuals. Indeed he proposed it himself. But he would have baulked at the suggestion it comprises a genuine reduction. For according to Lewis, counterfactuals are to be analysed, along with all other modal claims, as quantifications over possible worlds. These worlds are neither abstracta nor linguistic (or any other types of) representations, but are instead real concrete worlds alongside, but unconnected with, the actual world. Since we cannot coherently deny that a great many counterfactuals are true, there must really be a plurality of alternative concrete worlds individuated by their spatio-temporal connectedness.

Grant Lewis his plurality of worlds and then only an austere Humeanism on which "all there is to the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of particular fact" is needed to explain Stroud's triumvirate of metaphysical imponderables. Take causation. This is to be reduced to counterfactuals via the notion of causal dependence such that, at a first pass: If c and e are two distinct events, e causally depends on c if and only if were c not to occur, e would not occur. The counterfactual is in turn deemed true if and only if some world where c and e hold is closer to the actual world than any c-world in which e does not hold. Values are to be construed along with the subjectivist as those properties we are disposed to desire under the right conditions.

Some will object, and Stroud might wish to join them, that nothing is gained by such 'reductions' since Lewisian modal realism itself presents us with a large (indeed gargantuan!) metaphysical mystery, one far greater than any generated by causation, modality or value. However, Stroud has a different criticism of any reduction of causation to counterfactuals, viz., "it is the very idea of counterfactual or law-like modality that was to have been explained" (p. 36). This is no objection to Lewis's reductive account of modality, however: his plurality of worlds hypothesis is invoked to explain modality, not take it as primitive.

It is surprising Stroud doesn't address Lewis's proposed reductions qua demonstrations of Humean supervenience when it is Hume's views Stroud contests. All the more so when one considers that Lewis, together with Frank Jackson, developed a systematic program for answering the questions that confound Stroud. On the Lewis-Jackson 'Analytical Functionalist' view, our notions of cause, value and modality do indeed play a crucial role in metaphysics, just as Stroud perceives. But their role is not quite as Stroud imagines it: for these notions subserve the program of physicalism, allowing us to 'locate' suitable physical entities that deserve their folk appellations. Jackson calls this project 'serious metaphysics'.

Thus in his famous argument for the identity theory, Lewis averred that once the relevant folk platitudes are suitably Ramsified (i.e., expressed as a single long existentially quantified conjunction with key folk terms replaced by property variables) some neural state or other (e.g., C-fibre firings) will be found that realizes the functional role folk theory implicitly associates with the term 'pain' as this is explicated in the Ramsey Sentence. That neural state is the referent of the term 'pain'.

Failure to grasp the pivotal role folk platitudes play in thinking about colour or consciousness inevitably makes these phenomena look mysterious, and the same holds for the concepts that worry Stroud. As the platitudes serve to define the notions in question, suitably refined they express analytic truths. Metaphysical puzzles generated by value, modality and cause will dissipate once we find appropriate physical realizers for the functional roles folk theory associates with them.

Lewis's analytic physicalism is, of course, controversial but it provides a way out of Stroud's quandary. The indispensable role notions of value, cause and modality play in our thinking about the world is explained by folk platitudes defining these notions. Stroud's mistake on this view is to infer that conceptual indispensability is incompatible with any metaphysical reduction of these notions or, worse, that any putative reduction base must be made up of mind-dependent entities.

If a physical relation R could be found that made true most of the folk platitudes concerning causation, say, must it follow that R is the relation of causation? Not if physics has no place for causation. Whence, eliminativism about causation may be justified in such circumstances. Certainly, much work would then need to be done to explain how the illusion of an indispensable relation of causation could have arisen. But perhaps this is not the impossibility Stroud portrays it to be?

Stroud writes as if he thinks metaphysical beliefs are quite unlike empirical beliefs both in their truth and acceptance conditions. For it to be true that black holes exist the world need only contain black holes; for us to accept they exist the weight of evidence must support their existence. But Stroud intimates that even if it were to turn out that moral judgments are true or false independently of what anyone believes, this still would not suffice to show objective values exist. Neither would the fact that all evidence supports the objective truth of moral judgments compel us to accept objective moral values exist. This is because "We would also need a conception of what the world is really like on its own, independent of all human thoughts and processes" (p. 9). Yet wouldn't this requirement be satisfied by objectively true moral, causal or modal judgments? Isn't the reason we seek and value objectively true judgments precisely that they do tell us "what the world is really like on its own, independent of all human thoughts and processes"? If the demand is for something transcending 'mere' objective truth -- a 'view from nowhere', say -- then it is, I submit, a demand for something neither satisfiable nor necessary to satisfy.