Engaging Heidegger

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Richard Capobianco, Engaging Heidegger, Foreword by William J. Richardson, University of Toronto Press, 2010, 182pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781442641594.

Reviewed by Bret W. Davis, Loyola University Maryland


On numerous occasions throughout his life, Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) stated that his abiding philosophical concern was with "the question of Being." And yet, oddly, this question has been somewhat marginalized in much of recent scholarship on Heidegger. Indeed, when discussing last year a then forthcoming volume on Heidegger's "key concepts," I was asked by a colleague from Germany, with more than a tinge of irony, "Are you including anything on the question of Being?" Without diminishing the significance of investigations into the relevance of Heidegger's thought to everything from cognitive science to environmental ethics, it is perhaps high time for Heidegger scholars to also return their attention to his fundamental question of Being. This is exactly what Richard Capobianco does, especially in the first two chapters of his concise volume, Engaging Heidegger, a volume that is refreshing for its clarity and scholarly precision.[1] In the remaining chapters of his book, Capobianco variously attends to the matter that, for Heidegger, the question of Being (Sein) always entails at the same time the question of human being (Dasein).

Capobianco's first task is to refute those who claim that "Heidegger ultimately withdrew the name Being for die Sache selbst, that is, the fundamental matter for thought," or even that "Heidegger's focal topic never was 'being' in any of its forms" (6). In response to such claims, Capobianco not only cites numerous places where Heidegger himself claims that his central concern always remained the question of Being, including two letters from the last decade of his life (30-31), he also forcefully argues that other key terms in Heidegger's texts -- including aletheia, physis, Logos, hen, the clearing, the fourfold, and the holy -- should be understood as alternative names for the Ur-phenomenon of Being. This fundamental matter at issue -- that is, "Being itself" (das Sein selbst) or "Beyng" (das Seyn) in relation to, and in distinction from "beings" or "entities" (das Seiende) -- is named and renamed in Heidegger's lifetime of writings in order to bring into view "the varied features of this one, simple phenomenon."

So it is that we may also speak of the unconcealing of beings (aletheia), the emerging of beings (physis), the laying out and gathering of beings (Logos), the unifying, unfolding of beings (hen), the presencing of beings (Anwesen), the lighting/clearing of beings (Lichtung), the freeing of beings (das Freie); the letting of beings (Lassen), the giving of beings (Es gibt), and the appropriating or enowning of beings (Ereignis). (4, see also 8)

In Chapter 1, Capobianco focuses on the Four Seminars -- transcripts of Heidegger's meetings with French philosophers between 1966 and 1973 -- to examine this abiding question of Being. In Chapter 2, he takes special pains to show that Ereignis is "(only) another name for Being itself." In this case, he can refer to a great number of passages from Contributions to Philosophy and its sequel volumes where Heidegger explicitly and repeatedly states that Beyng is, or presences (west) as, Ereignis (39-42).

Seyn (Beyng) is the older spelling of Sein (Being) that Heidegger often uses, starting in the 1930s, and especially in Contributions to Philosophy and his other "private manuscripts," in order to clearly distinguish the originary sense of Being that he is concerned with from the metaphysical sense of Being as "beingness" (Seiendheit). Unfortunately, Heidegger did not remain consistent in this terminological distinction, and Capobianco explains how Heidegger's inconsistent uses of the term "Being" -- sometimes meaning "beingness" and sometimes meaning "Beyng" -- have given rise to much confusion. To help clear up this confusion, Capobianco uses "Being" only to refer to Heidegger's non-metaphysical sense of "Being" (i.e., as synonymous with "Beyng"), and "beingness" to refer to the metaphysical sense of this term.

The "beingness of beings," die Seiendheit des Seienden, refers to the presence (Anwesenheit) of things, which also means their essence in the sense of, for example, what Plato calls eidos (18). This or that being or entity is always perceived and understood in terms of its beingness, understood as its essence which remains constantly present, and the Western tradition of metaphysics has answered the question of Being in terms of this sense of beingness. Metaphysical answers to this question of the beingness of beings include ousia (substance, essence), actualitas (actuality), and, in modern times, representational objectness for a subject (9). What is forgotten or covered over in this metaphysical tradition of asking only after the beingness of beings is precisely the origin or temporal/historical emergence of these conceptions of what it means for beings to be. This is Heidegger's question of Being, by which he means "the finite and negatived emerging / unfolding / coming-to-presence of beings in their beingness" (9).

Throughout his book, Capobianco variously reiterates the definition of Being (or Beyng or Being itself), for example as "the temporal-spatial, finite and negative, unconcealing of beings (das Seiende) in their beingness (die Seiendheit) as made manifest meaningfully by Dasein in language" (34). I found these reiterations to be illuminating and insightful. The one I would like to single out for critical reflection appears in the penultimate paragraph of the book. There Being is defined one last time as:

the temporal-spatial flow of all beings: the coming and going, appearing and disappearing, arriving and departing of beings; the emerging and lingering and passing away of all that is. And we -- Dasein -- are carried along this flow, temporally stretched out in our own peculiar way between birth and death. Being itself is phainesthei, the temporal shining-forth of beings (142 -- 3).

What first struck me as question-worthy here is the definition of Being as a "flow." Unlike nearly every other key term used by Capobianco in his extremely careful explications and interpretations, no text was cited in support of his final definition of Being as a "flow." Can we find support for this definition in Heidegger's texts? If we go as far back as 1919, we find Heidegger grappling with the question of how phenomenology can keep from objectifying and therefore stilling "the flowing stream of lived experiences [den abfließenden Strom der Erlebnisse]."[2] But what about in his mature thought?[3] I can recall two relevant passages: one that speaks against and one that speaks for understanding Being in terms of a "flow."

The first is from Contributions to Philosophy, where Heidegger contrasts his own understanding of the "finitude of Beyng" with that of an infinitude, understood either in the metaphysical sense of a "closed circle," or in the mundane sense of what Heidegger derides as a "endless flowing and running amuck [das verfließende, nur sich verlaufende Endlose]." Heidegger here characterizes his own sense of the finitude of Being as the conflictual (strittig) turn (Kehre) of Ereignis.[4] According to the conception of Ereignis in Heidegger's middle period, human being or Da-sein is not simply "carried along" by the "flow" of Being, but must take part in the punctuated eventfulness of the conflictual strife of Being itself. Being is not simply "phainesthai, the temporal shining-forth of beings," if that were mistaken to mean that Being is merely a flow of surface appearances; for the strife of Being essentially involves the "negativity" of concealment and withdrawal -- which also indicates its depth dimension. To be sure, in Contributions Heidegger is in the process of turning away from the language of forcefully bringing to a stand the violent onslaught of Being (a language one finds most pronounced in the 1935 Introduction to Metaphysics), and turning toward his later conception of the proper comportment of human being as that of Gelassenheit to the Seinlassen of Being itself. But it is crucial to bear in mind that, to the end, Heidegger stresses that human beings must participate or engage in (Sicheinlassen) the appropriating event of Being, and not simply "go with the flow" in the sense of a sheer passivity.[5]

On the other hand, if we understand "going with the flow" in a sense analogous to what Daoism calls "the doing of non-doing" (wei-wuwei), then we may indeed be close to what the later Heidegger meant by Gelassenheit. And, in fact, it is precisely in one of Heidegger's rare allusions to Eastern thought that we can find support for Capobianco's use of the term "flow" to describe Being. Heidegger writes that the Dao could be "the way that gives all ways … a great hidden stream which moves all things along and makes way for everything."[6] This passage would seem particularly relevant in this context, since at several junctures Capobianco himself invites the reader to carefully pursue the apparent proximity of Heidegger's thought to that of East Asia.

Let me now briefly summarize the content of the remaining chapters of Engaging Heidegger, raising along the way a few questions for the sake of thinking further about the key issues to which Capobianco so adroitly calls our attention. Chapters 3 and 4 deal with the question of the most authentic mode, or fundamental attunement, of human being or Dasein. In Chapter 3, Capobianco traces a shift in Heidegger's thought from an early emphasis on unsettledness or not-at-homeness to a later emphasis on homecoming, and in Chapter 4 he traces a parallel shift in mood from Angst to astonishment and Gelassenheit. However, whereas in the latter chapter Capobianco largely affirms the shift as a maturing of Heidegger's thought, in the former he argues that at a midway point, namely in Heidegger's 1942 commentary on Hölderlin's poem, "The Ister," Heidegger gave his "most satisfying phenomenological account of being human" as essentially "being at home in being-not-at-home." (52).

I fully agree with Capobianco's preference for a nuanced understanding of authentic human being as "being at home in being-not-at-home." However, I would like to clarify one crucial issue, and also ask whether this nuanced characterization does not in fact remain in the later Heidegger's thought. The issue I want to clarify is that there are two kinds of "being at home," namely, on the one hand, being at home among beings in the sense of "fallen" into an absorption in them and hence fallen away from an attentiveness to Being, and, on the other hand, being at home in nearness to Being, which means to never be entirely at home among beings, to always be open to a rethinking of their beingness (compare 60, 62, and 78). This means that to be at home in Being, to dwell "near the Source," is never to be wholly settled amidst beings disclosed in a particular way. Now, Capobianco quotes the later Heidegger as writing "Releasement toward things and openness to mystery give us a vision of a new rootedness," and criticizes this by saying "Apparently, the journey home for Dasein no longer essentially and necessarily passes through the unheimlich" (66). However, to be "released toward things" and "open to the mystery" entails precisely a freedom from captivation by beings and a dwelling in nearness to the self-concealing of Being. And so, the "new rootedness" the later Heidegger speaks of retains the desired complexity of "being at home in being-not-at-home."

With regard to Chapter 4, and mindful of the fact that Capobianco explicitly does not claim to offer "a comprehensive analysis of the issue of affective disposition in Heidegger's work" (71), there is one particularly relevant episode I would like to mention in order to complicate the story he tells. In the latter half of the 1930s, Heidegger claims that "astonishment" is the basic disposition or fundamental attunement proper to the "first inception" of philosophy with the ancient Greeks; and, following his most thorough analysis of this Greek attunement of "astonishment" (see 159n. 39), Heidegger concludes that in the impending "other inception" of philosophy, "the fundamental attunement can no longer be that of astonishment" but must rather be that of "startled dismay" or "shock" (Erschrecken).[7] This claim is repeated in Contributions, where he adds "restraint" (Verhaltenheit) along with "awe" (Scheu) and "presaging" (Er-ahnen) to "shock" as the proper fundamental attunement of the other inception.[8] The question this raises for Capobianco's analysis is this: Does Heidegger later change his mind and after all call for a retrieval of (Greek) astonishment?

In Chapters 5 and 6, Capobianco provides a close textual study of the development of Heidegger's notion of die Lichtung. In the 1960s, Heidegger stressed that his notion of Lichtung "has nothing to do with light [Licht]," but refers rather to something like a "clearing" in the forest, an open place where, at night as well as during the day, "the forest is passable" (95). Capobianco demonstrates, however, that prior to this time Heidegger had in fact frequently associated Lichtung with light. He speculates that the reason Heidegger distanced himself from the metaphorics of light was that, whereas for the metaphysical and theological tradition, in the words of Thomas Aquinas, "all that is made manifest [truth/veritas] is light," for Heidegger, "all that is made manifest (aletheia) is not just light, but both light and darkness in the clearing" (100).

Let me raise a question and venture a suggestion regarding a striking passage quoted by Capobianco from an important text that he has recently co-translated, where Heidegger alludes to "the region to which the clearing, in turn, belongs" (116). Although Capobianco ends up suggesting that "Heidegger employs both Lichtung [clearing] and Bereich [region] in this passage to characterize the one, simple, and fundamental phenomenon" of Being itself (118), he also, in passing, points us toward the notion of die Gegnet in "Conversation on a Country Path Concerning Thinking" (117). Indeed, Heidegger says that die Gegnet (which I translate as "open-region") is what "the open" (das Offene) is in itself, rather than merely the side of it turned toward us; it is the "the open and yet veiled expanse" which surrounds and sustains the limited openness of our human horizons.[9] It is thus not itself a determinate "phenomenon" but rather that which surrounds -- and thus both holds within itself and withholds itself from -- the field of phenomenal appearances. Hence, the question is whether die Gegnet is as such the clearing, or whether it is the indeterminate "forest" surrounding the clearing and letting it be the always delimited openness that is needed in turn to let beings be (i.e., let phenomena show themselves). Perhaps die Gegnet, as this abyssally open and thus self-concealing and impenetrable "forest," is what Heidegger means by "the region to which the clearing, in turn, belongs."

In Chapter 7, Capobianco takes up the issue of "building," arguing that "both deconstructivist and postmodern architecture end up sharing with modernist architecture something in common, namely, an avoidance of the richness of place" (129) -- a richness that Heidegger attunes us to in his thought of "the inexhaustible gathering of meaning in a defined place" (130). In Chapter 8, Capobianco compares Heidegger's (early) interpretation of Antigone with that of Lacan, showing how they both favor a "heroic rendering of Antigone's tragic situation" over a more classical reading which stresses "an abiding respect for limit and measure," or "sophrosyne" (131), and he argues in the end for a balanced perspective on the human situation. Along with the rest of Engaging Heidegger, these chapters are also eminently, well, engaging. I am sure that others will join me in looking forward to further stimulating and illuminating reflections on Heidegger by this careful scholar and insightful thinker.

[1] All parenthetical numbers in this review indicate page numbers in this book. I generally follow the author's choice of translations for terms and capitalization of "Being" and "Beyng."

[2] Martin Heidegger, Gesamtausgabe [hereafter abbreviated as "GA"] (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1999), vol. 56/57, p. 101; see also p. 116; Towards the Definition of Philosophy, trans. Ted Sadler (London/New York: Continuum, 2000), 85, translation modified; see also 98.

[3] Heidegger's reading of Hölderlin's poem, "The Ister," may come to mind; but here, as Capobianco writes, "the truth of the river" is rather "the truth of human being," in the sense that it flows both forth and back, and so, in Heidegger's words, "The Ister satisfies the law of becoming at home as the law of being-not-at-home" (63).

[4] GA 65: 268-9; Contributions to Philosophy (From Enowning), trans. Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999), 189, translation modified.

[5] Let me stress that I do not think Capobianco intended to say that Dasein is "carried along" the flow of Being in the sense of sheer passivity; indeed, I have no reason to believe that he would not agree with the clarification I am pursuing.

[6] GA 12: 187; On the Way to Language, trans. Peter D. Hertz (New York: Harper & Row, 1971), 92.

[7] GA 45: 184, 197; Basic Questions of Philosophy, trans. Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1984), 159, 169, translation modified.

[8] GA 65: 14-15, 20, 46; Contributions, 11-12, 15, 32, translation modified.

[9] See GA 77: 114, 205; Country Path Conversations, trans. Bret W. Davis (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2010), 74, 132.