Enlightenment and Action from Descartes to Kant: Passionate Thought

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Losonsky, Michael, Enlightenment and Action from Descartes to Kant: Passionate Thought, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 240 pp, $54.95 (hdk), ISBN 0-521-80612-7

Reviewed by Catherine Wilson, University of British Columbia


Michael Losonsky aims to reconstruct the genesis of the view that Enlightenment, the emergence from what Kant thought of as a state of tutelage, requires public activity. His central claim is that the perfection of the human understanding, though initially formulated as a personal, not a social task by Descartes early in the 17th century, is already conceived as a problem concerning the application of the will to the guidance of thought. This volitional element finally bears fruit in the Kantian conception of Enlightenment. Along the way, Losonsky essays some comparative remarks with respect to contemporary cognitive science, but this theme is peripheral to his overall account.

By way of making out his thesis, Losonsky present two opposed positions, current in the hundred and fifty or so years covered by his study, regarding the best treatment for distraction, error, and irresolution. One position was that the mind was endowed with its own light and needed only to be freed to operate untrammeled by removing the accretions of culture and dogma, and encouraging disregard for authority. On this view, the mind is “automatic, involuntary and inspired” and reflects the external world or has a natural tropism towards the truth. The other position was that the mind needed to be placed in harness, its natural tendencies to waywardness disciplined by adherence to method. On the second view, the mind is “an artifact of voluntary human activity” and to achieve enlightenment is to show resolution and firmness, to take control of the “workmanship of the understanding,” and to channel it into the construction of legitimate concepts and productive trains of thought. Losonsky argues that both the bridled and unbridled conceptions of ideal human reason came together in the notion that enlightenment was impossible in the absence of freedom of association, and freedom not just of conscience but of expression. By way of illustration he considers in turn Descartes, Hobbes, Locke, John Webster and his Boehmist friends, Henry More, Spinoza, Leibniz, Christian Wolff, and Wolff’s followers.

Losonsky begins with Descartes’s employment of his will power to address the problem what to believe in a condition of uncertainty and irresolution. He interprets Descartes as discovering that intellection left allowed to roam generates paralyzing skeptical hypotheses that can only be refuted by striving to carry forward a line of reasoning to its terminus, and by discriminating between adventitious ideas that merely happen to fill our minds and ideas with formal reality that represent the world and its contents as they are. “For Descartes it is on account of the fact that we have a will that we come to know that there are other things besides us”(p. 40). Voluntary, disciplined thought reveals that we do have bodies and that we exist in a world of material objects whose properties we can know (ibid.). Hobbes, in turn, takes regulated mental discourse to be “passionate thought,” which he contrasts with dreams, in which phantasms succeed each other without order (p. 52). He favours the view (often ascribed to Wittgenstein) that there is no thought without language (p. 68), and he requires an embodied mind for thinking to be possible. On this basis, Losonsky ascribes to him the view that “internal states… are mental states only if they are embedded in a natural and social environment “(p. 71). Locke proves to be interested in guiding and controlling thought, preserving it from distracting and inappropriate ideas, and replacing uneasy thoughts by moral motives (p. 76). We make our own complex ideas, according to Locke, and he resorts frequently to the metaphor of manual labour in discussing knowledge acquisition. We bring the world home piecemeal by stocking our heads in an orderly fashion with ideas of it (p. 87).

Meanwhile, enthusiastic writers express an aversion to knowledge that is acquired laboriously or through the application of the sinful human will and not through divinely-inspired illumination or insight into the nature of things. Losonsky presents the critic of the universities, John Webster, who excoriated book-learning as his exemplar, tracing his position to the dissemination of the popular works of Jacob Boehme. Losonsky argues that Henry More, officially a critic of Enthusiasm, does not escape its influence, (p. 121f.) Passing to Spinoza, Losonsky emphasizes his external and internal relationship to Enthusiasm. Spinoza’s emphasis on “inner conviction” (p. 133) and spiritual automaticity are downright Quakerish, and Losonksy patiently extracts a set of code words and concepts in Spinoza’s writings that link him to enthusiastic sectarianism, from the claim that “seeking in the soul” is not from an act of will (p.135), that the mind can mirror nature (p. 136), that the intellect is “wholly passive” (p. 139), that we are “slaves” of God (p. 141), and that we pass from thought to thought in ways not driven by us (p.148). As with the English sectarians, faith in the mind’s involuntary affinity for truth is allied with a belief in the right of free speech. For Spinoza, authoritarian control of speech is futile and dangerous for the somewhat surprising reason that people cannot control their speech-production anymore than they can control the automaticity of their thoughts. Men cannot govern their tongues (p. 155).

Leibniz, in Losonsky’s view, marks a return to disciplined thinking. He is annoyed by Spinoza’s failure to articulate a method in On the Improvement of the Understanding (p. 162). The language that reveals real essences is held by Leibniz to be the product of hard analytical work, after the fashion of Webster’s opponent, John Wilkins, not intuition. Although, according to the terms of Leibniz’s metaphysics, the mind is a kind of spiritual automaton whose thoughts follow a predetermined path, this view seems to leave Leibniz free to shift the emphasis to the potential workmanship of the public understanding. Intriguing in this respect is Leibniz’s notion that social good can only be accomplished by groups who mobilize and communicate amongst themselves. “The importance of association,” according to Losonsky, “is not a minor feature of Leibniz’s political opinions, but a central feature of his metaphysics” (p.181). He quotes a striking passage in which Leibniz expresses the view that, not only should people should be freed from “annoying inconveniences,” but also the poor must be given “the means of earning their livelihood…. [by] taking an interest in agriculture, by furnishing to artisans materials and a market, by educating them to make their productions better, and finally by putting an end to idleness and to abusive practices in manufactures and in commerce” (p. 184).

The final chapter discusses Christian Wolff’s extension of Leibnizian welfarism, his defense of the need for schools and academies “devoted to the pursuit of truth unhindered by political and financial concerns” (p. 192) and his near martyrdom for academic freedom. This is followed by some attention to Ernst Ferdinand Klein, a Wolffian defender of freedom of thought and a free press, whose writings Losonsky believes to have propelled Kant into the debates over censorship and enlightenment, and to Karl Leonard Reinhold, whose interest in education as a solution to the social problems of the labouring classes is briefly discussed (p. 197).

Enlightenment and Action is not without its problems. Though the treatments of individual philosophers are stimulating and memorable, especially the discussion of Spinoza, readers who are not already well versed in these texts will find them hard going. And claims such as that association is a basic principle of Leibnizian metaphysics will seem puzzling to persons who have been taught the more orthodox version of the lonely monad. The motive for identifying voluntary and public activity (p. 104, et passim) needs more explanation than it receives, and the relationships between the main topics addressed, embodied thought, enthusiasm, indecision, the nature of language, the exercise of free speech, and the public weal, could have been more explicitly laid out. Finally, while it is considered good form to lead up to Kant as the culmination of every fruitful line of thought, Losonsky’s own final chapter confirmed this reader’s impression that Kant, whatever his other virtues, is one of the less interesting representatives of Enlightenment. Klein and Reinhold are more compelling authors in this respect, and in their writings we seem to have come a long way from Spinoza’s archaic division of humanity into philosophers and fools.

Losonsky’s focus is on ideas about thought and action, not on the behaviour of 17th and 18th century passionate thinkers, but it is difficult to understand the evolution of the conception of Enlightenment without being aware of the disruptive and unconventional acts associated with the radical Protestantism of the Interregnum, and their relationship to the history of censorship and toleration, and so to the problem of public reason. The role of the 18th century trade in banned and unauthorized books on the Continent is another integral part of the total picture. For these reasons, Enlightenment and Action is most satisfactorily approached as a study of epistemology rather than as intellectual history. It brings into focus a 17th century conflict, more often than not present within a single mind, between the often sympathetic temptations of enthusiasm, and the sober belief that the way to knowledge is necessarily labored and indirect. Taking this contrast as his starting point, Losonsky has put a range of new issues onto the table and he has made a admirable start at unraveling the question of the relationship of the reform of knowledge to private virtue on one hand and to contributions to the public weal on the other, as these tasks were conceived in the 17th century.