Enlightenment Shadows

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Genevieve Lloyd, Enlightenment Shadows, Oxford University Press, 2013, 185pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669561.

Reviewed by Mark Collier, University of Minnesota, Morris


Genevieve Lloyd argues that standard interpretations of the Enlightenment have failed to acknowledge the shadows and tensions lurking behind talk of illumination, including ambivalence about the imagination and its interaction with the emotions, as well as a sense of vulnerability in the face of parochialism and religious enthusiasm. Lloyd attempts to present a fuller picture of the intellectual mood of the Enlightenment by offering a series of close readings of Enlightenment texts that explore, and enact in their literary form, the complex relationship between the intellect and the passions. The result is an alternative history of Modern Philosophy that exhibits continuities, rather than definitive breaks, between the concerns of the Enlightenment and Romantic periods.

In the first chapter, 'Cosmopolitan Imagining: Montesquieu's Persian Letters', Lloyd begins by situating this work in the context of early modern travel writing. Montesquieu's text invites readers, in a similar manner to Montaigne's 'Of Cannibals' and Diderot's Supplement to the Voyage of Bougainville, to view their own culture and habits at a critical distance by imaginatively projecting themselves into the perspectives of aliens and strangers. Montesquieu depicts the de-familiarization that travelers undergo as they negotiate the various cross-cultural differences between Persian and European societies. This literary technique prompts readers to imagine alternative possibilities, particularly with regard to ideals of freedom and equality, as well as relations between the sexes. What emerges from this type of cosmopolitan imagining is not a version of moral relativism, where Persian and European commitments and values are both right, but rather a type of pluralism in which diverse values and attitudes are grounded in common human nature yet adapted to unique cultural contexts.

In a brief second chapter, 'In Celebration of Not Knowing: Voltaire's Voices', Lloyd attempts to discern Voltaire's authentic identity from the layers of rhetorical disguises, and theatrical twists and turns, that characterize his religious writings. This task is of course made difficult by the fact that Voltaire deliberately wore ironic masks in order to shield himself from prosecution. What emerges is a subtle piece of detective work, especially with regard to the essay on 'atheism' in the Philosophical Dictionary, where theism undergoes a reversal of roles, and moves from being the accuser to the accused. But Lloyd's general characterization of Voltaire -- as a proponent of toleration and critic of zealous belief -- strikes me as fairly conventional.

The third chapter, 'Hume's Sceptic', offers a close reading of Hume's essay on happiness. Lloyd questions the dominant reading of commentators like Myles Burnyeat who attempt to assimilate Hume's skeptical writings to those of the classical Pyrrhonists. This traditional reading captures the spirit of Hume's skeptical pronouncements in the Treatise and Enquiries, according to Lloyd, but 'The Sceptic' recasts his epistemology in novel ways by grounding its objective recommendations about the good life in our passionate responses and common experiences. This reading is buttressed with a short analysis of Hume's discussion of critical objectivity in 'Of the Standard of Taste'. This chapter provides a readable overview of Hume's essays, but there is a significant lack of engagement with the wider Hume literature, and the reading as a whole is not sufficiently controversial. There is also a missed opportunity to examine the relationship between Montesquieu's approach to the collision of cultures in Persian Letters and Hume's attempt to negotiate evaluative diversity in 'The Skeptic' and 'A Dialogue'.

Lloyd offers a brief overview of Smith's account of sympathy and its role in moral judgment in, 'As Seen by Others: Adam Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments'. The chapter attempts to cover a range of topics, including several interesting reflections on Smith's account of sympathizing with the dead, as well as his provocative views concerning the role of moral luck in punishment. But one might wonder whether it tries to do too much. Several of the topics that it addresses -- including Smith's debt to the Stoics -- are touched upon very briefly, and there is no sustained engagement with previous work done on these topics. There is also little examination of the relationship between Hume and Smith on sympathy and the moral point of view.

The fifth chapter, '"Changing the Common Mode of Thinking": d'Alembert and Diderot on the Encyclopedia', is a short but provocative examination of the alternative epistemologies that shape the plan of the Encyclopedia. The primary texts considered include d'Alembert's Preliminary Discourse and Diderot's entry 'The Encyclopedia'. Lloyd explores the tension involved in founding this project on the universal structure of the mind while simultaneously attempting to incorporate the shifting perspectives of particular time periods. The chapter also briefly situates the rival ways of knowing embraced by d'Alembert and Diderot in the context of Francis Bacon, the Stoics, and Kant. There appear to be, however, two problems with this chapter. The first is that the emphasis on the metaphors (maps, circles, trees) and conceptual organization of the Encyclopedia is misplaced, since the work was ultimately structured according to a straightforward alphabetic list. Second, one wishes that Lloyd had made the connections between this chapter and the larger theme of the volume more clear, especially since the Encyclopedia project provides prima facie support to the traditional interpretation of the Enlightenment as grounded on notions of reason and progress, rather than the interaction of imagination and emotion.

Lloyd offers a close reading of one of Diderot's novels in the sixth chapter, 'The Attractions of Instability: Diderot's Rameau's Nephew'. She briefly comments on a variety of topics, including Diderot's controversial stances on music and theater, as well as Hegel's and Foucault's influential interpretations of the novel. Her main focus, however, is the theme of indeterminacy, as represented in the novel by the character Lui. Lloyd's interpretation is highly provisional, of course, given the ambiguous nature of the novel. What emerges is a clever reading as unstable as the text it examines.

In the seventh and final chapter, 'Kantian Cosmopolitanism: Perpetual Peace', Lloyd offers a highly readable commentary on Kant's project in international ethics. Lloyd carefully reconstructs, and critically questions, the teleological assumptions that frame Kant's analysis of the set of rights that serve as conditions of world peace. She conjoins this reading with short summaries of recent extensions of Kantian political philosophy into topics such as strangers and migration (Benhabib) as well as the imaginative enlarging of the mind (Arendt). The focus on imagination in the chapter provides thematic connection with the larger project of her book, although it appears to misrepresent the nature of Kant's own epistemological commitments. There is a related worry that Kant's utopian political writings, as with the Encyclopedia project of d'Alembert and Diderot, cohere more closely to the traditional narrative about the Enlightenment, and do little to support Lloyd's alternative reading of this period as centered on concern and uneasiness about the influence of imagination and emotion.

Lloyd's book succeeds as a collection of close readings of Eighteenth Century texts. The main strength of the book lies with its novel emphasis on literary form and intellectual tone, as well as the traditionally overlooked topics of imagination and emotion. The writing is consistently masterly and elegant, and there are innumerable particular insights about the works she examines. But the decision to focus on a narrow range of texts insures that one cannot really draw any generalizations about the Enlightenment as a whole. And the loose connections between the various chapters mean that one seeking a systematic account of the Enlightenment must look elsewhere.