Environmental Culture: The Ecological Crisis of Reason

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Plumwood, Val, Environmental Culture: The Ecological Crisis of Reason, Routledge, 2002, 291pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415178789.

Reviewed by Chris Cuomo, Cornell University and University of Cincinnati


Val Plumwood’s most recent book is part of a series entitled “Environmental Philosophies.” With that name emblazoned on its cover (three times), and Plumwood’s own title, the work presents itself as a contribution to a particular branch of philosophy, rather than to philosophy in general. Marketing issues aside, that is really too bad. Plumwood presents us with a detailed and passionate argument for forms of culture—forms of being—that are logically and pragmatically superior to those cultures built on rationalism, idealism, empiricism, and other philosophical systems that encourage moral distance. Her focus is on the ways common Western philosophical and practical conceptions of knowledge, goodness, and existence have ignored the grand and absolute significance of the natural world and have therefore brought us to the brink of global ecological disaster. But is there any good reason to think of this work as “environmental philosophy” and not just philosophy? What idea of “philosophy” benefits from the ghettoization of philosophical perspectives that are deeply attentive to the threatened, complex natural world upon which all life depends?

Readers of Val Plumwood’s Feminism and the Mastery of Nature (Routledge 1993) will find that the bulk of Environmental Culture consists of a more nuanced and thorough presentation of the critical arguments found in that earlier work. Plumwood’s basic position is that the ecological crises we currently face are the result of arrogant cultures (based in arrogant philosophical views) that deny the fact that humans are dependent on nature, men are dependent on women, and those with economic and decision-making power are dependent on disempowerment of others. Cultures built on the legacies of Platonic dualism (which posits reason as separate from and superior to nature, or matter) and empiricism (which admits that nature is relevant to knowledge, but debases it nonetheless) fail to acknowledge the existence and importance of “the Other”—nature, women, indigenous people, and anyone identified with the less powerful side of the reason/matter dualism. They therefore allow for and encourage mindsets and practices that harm those “others” on which the privileged at the center of reality depend.

For Plumwood, arrogance is philosophically deep. It is enabled by metaphysics that describe ultimate being as that which is the absolute opposite of nature or matter. It is bolstered by epistemologies that take knowledge to be rightly dominating, disembodied, and singular in form. It is justified by ethics that see detached autonomy as a moral goal and that consider humans the paradigm of moral considerability. It is encouraged by political systems where privileged elites are able to maintain severe remoteness from the social and ecological consequences of their decisions. And it is presupposed by science that is driven by the dictates of economic rationalism and that interprets “impartiality” as “for sale to the highest bidder” (43).

Plumwood moves beyond the general feminist claim that dualistic conceptions of rationality enable exploitation by creating hierarchies of opposed categories (masculine knowing subjects vs. feminine objects, knowing minds vs. feeling bodies, scientific knowledge vs. intuition). While many philosophers have discussed the problem of dualisms as a failure to assign appropriate value to the denigrated, Plumwood argues that an ethical emphasis on value and rights inevitably create rankings that replicate the myth of the Great Chain of Being and continue to measure all other life in comparison to humans. Instead of thinking of the project of ethics as a matter of extending the boundaries of human-centered thought and recognizing the value of others in relation to human worth, Plumwood suggests that we begin with basic respect for all life and approach others with an ethos of intentional recognition and openness.

To those familiar with ecofeminism and other social ecologies, the general outline of this position will not be very surprising. Nonetheless, Plumwood’s detailed exploration of the philosophical background sharpens social ecology’s critique of dominant cultures. And the positive project—her inspiring descriptions of realistic alternatives to arrogant epistemologies and ethics—makes a deeply significant philosophical contribution. For example, in her final chapter, “Towards a Materialist Spirituality of Place,” Plumwood draws on the work of indigenous American and aboriginal Australian writers (including Carol Lee Sanchez and Bill Neidjie) to articulate a notion of spirituality that assumes physical connection and interdependence, rather than seeking deliverance from the world:

We have the option to ask for little in the way of a separate individual essence that persists after death, but be satisfied with a materialist spirituality which recognizes that spirit is not a hyper-separated extra ingredient but a certain mode of organisation of a material body (223).

Such spirituality is grounded in place and in loving attention to the world that sustains us. It does not long for immortality but instead finds solace in the fact that all bodies are food, all food is souls, and all souls get recycled. In this view, all of nature and life are thought of in gift exchange terms.

Val Plumwood acknowledges that the political and spiritual alternatives she points toward “challenge the existing order very deeply, and fundamentally at many levels” (235). Her critical argument hinges on the basic observation that influential conceptions of rationality make it virtually impossible to see nonhumans as agents in their own right and as communicative beings and systems that are “mindful” in ways often utterly unlike humans. But if we begin with the belief that the other is potentially communicative, we will find that the world is communicatively rich and even full of “mind” (though we will not necessarily find that everyone and everything else is “like us”). Openness to reciprocal relations with others requires knowledge, but the tools for communication and dialogue are readily available: “Reading embodied action is part of all our lives, and is the common language of embodied beings” (192). Our relationships with the world can therefore be dialogues, rather than monologues that assume only humans, or elite humans, are capable of meaningful communication.

Throughout the book, Plumwood emphasizes the extent to which what passes as rationality is actually highly irrational. At the most fundamental level, our failure to appreciate the fact that the natural world sustains us, and that our flourishing depends upon its flourishing, is a highly irrational response to the world. Indeed, it is easy to question the rationality of science and other spheres of knowledge production when “we can link overfishing to fisheries science and fishing technology, land salinisation and degradation to irrigation and agricultural technology, the disasters of intensive agriculture and genetic engineering to biological, agricultural, and forestry science…and transportation, combustion, and refrigeration technology to global warming and the ozone hole” (38). But although Plumwood is deeply critical of particular modes of rationality, she clearly relies on another understanding of rationality to develop her critique. In a move reminiscent of Sandra Harding’s call for “strong objectivity” (approaches that approximate objectivity by taking into account as many relevant perspectives as possible), Plumwood presents a positive conception of rationality that is “more rational.” She considers rationality not a singular aspect of mind but a form of life, “a matter of balance, harmony, and reconcilability among an organism’s identities, faculties and ends, a harmony that has regard to the kind of being it is” (67). True rationality therefore calls for socially and ecologically healthy decisions and acknowledges the embodiment of knowers, the contextuality of all knowledge, and the necessity of caring for flourishing.

Plumwood’s most obvious philosophical starting point is her own deep and intimate relationship with the more-than-human world, and this fact shines through in sometimes luminous prose (her description of “twilight communication in southern Gondwanic rainforest” is worth the price of admission). In addition, the work of feminist philosophers such as Teresa Brennan and Marilyn Frye informs her analysis of the “feminization” of the natural world and others, and her critique of arrogant rationalism and Platonic dualisms. The rich and sophisticated system of “interspecies communicative ethics” that Plumwood recommends as the readily available antidote to arrogant cultures is also built on the insights of recent feminist philosophy. This work is typified in Margaret Walker’s description of ethics as a “lattice of similar themes—personal relationships, nurturance and caring, maternal experience, emotional responsiveness, attunement to particular persons and contexts, sensitivity to open-ended responsibilities” (187).

Another profound influence on the work, and arguably the most important, is indigenous wisdom, and especially the ways and writings of aboriginal Australian and Native American thinkers. Instead of getting bogged down in misplaced worries that any use of indigenous wisdom is colonialist appropriation or that no claims are universally true of all indigenous peoples, Plumwood draws on particular examples to exhibit the fact that interspecies communicative ethics is not an abstract philosophical ideal but an ancient and still-present cultural practice. This grounding in indigenous thought provides a useful reference point (such as preventing the reader from taking the history of Western philosophy to be the history of philosophical thought). It also helps Plumwood go against the party line in some interesting ways. For instance, animal rights theory begins with the assumption that only those beings not admitted to the class of rights-holders (or valued beings) can ethically become food. It therefore emphasizes one practice—vegetarianism—as the marker of morally appropriate relations with nonhuman animals, and characteristically has a difficult time drawing the line between the beings who matter ethically, and those who do not.

But according to Plumwood, the very premise of the animal rights approach, and the assumption that to matter ethically something must be similar to humans, creates the line-drawing problem. She writes, “Any position which has thus equated availability as food with moral exclusion is thereby committed to moral dualism and to an exclusionary imperative, since it is forced to insist on a substantial outclass of living beings that are morally excluded in order to locate any viable form of eating which allows for an ethical basis for human survival” (155). Particular indigenous cultures provide models of respectful and reverential use, including respectful hunting and meat-eating. They thereby challenge us to consider what it really means for all forms of life to matter ethically (even if they matter in different ways), and how we might develop models of agriculture that are respectful of the forms of life (including plant forms) that become our food.

Val Plumwood’s Environmental Culture is a work that is both sophisticated and basic. It provides an excellent introduction for philosophers curious about the field of “environmental philosophy” or about the connections between ecological and social issues, and it is also a book around which one could construct a terrific graduate seminar. But beyond its obvious relevance to environmental issues, this carefully argued work addresses important and timely questions about the meaning of rationality, the nature of ethics, and the future of philosophy. It would be unfortunate if a particular sub-disciplinary label were to prevent a wider segment of the philosophical community from reading it or taking it seriously.