Environmental Justice: Creating Equality, Reclaiming Democracy

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Shrader-Frechette, Kristin, Environmental Justice: Creating Equality, Reclaiming Democracy, Oxford University Press, 2002, 288pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195152034.

Reviewed by Katie McShane, North Carolina State University


Consider the following:

60% of African-Americans in the U.S. live in areas endangered by hazardous waste landfills [12].
7,000-11,000 U.S. workers die annually from workplace injuries [135].
62,000-86,000 U.S. workers die prematurely from diseases such as cancer induced by workplace conditions [135].
29% of pesticides exported by the U.S. to other countries are so dangerous that they cannot legally be used in the U.S. [164].
49,000 people die annually of pesticide poisoning, most of them in the developing world [164].

Certainly these are appalling and deplorable states of affairs. But are they instances of injustice? Those in the Environmental Justice Movement have long been arguing that they are – that these situations aren’t just the result of individuals’ bad luck or poor choices, but rather of an unjust distribution of environmental benefits and burdens.

Kristin Shrader-Frechette’s latest book is an attempt to defend these claims of injustice philosophically. The book is a collection of nine semi-autonomous essays, parts of which have appeared in other published works of hers going back to 1985. Each chapter takes us through at least one case study exemplifying a particular type of environmental injustice and then details the ethical principles in virtue of which it counts as injustice. The book concludes with a discussion of the obligations that ordinary citizens have toward fighting environmental injustice and suggestions for how this might best be done.

The overarching ethical principle, which Shrader-Frechette defends in the second chapter and refers to throughout the book, is what she calls the Principle of Prima Facie Political Equality (PPFPE). Unfortunately, we never get a clear statement of the principle itself, and this omission poses a challenge to readers. However, we do get a discussion of the principle’s two “components”: distributive justice and participative justice. The distributive component concerns the “morally proper apportionment of benefits and burdens” [24]. It “presumes that equality is defensible and that only different or unequal treatment requires justification” [27]. The “equality” in question is political equality, to be understood as “equality of treatment under the law” [25]. “Equality of treatment” is treatment “proportional to the strength of one’s claims to it,” which may vary according to one’s merit, compensation due to one, one’s special needs, or society’s general interest in providing incentives for certain kinds of actions [26]. Political equality “often requires economic equality, at least in the sense of equal economic opportunity” [25]. The participative component of the PPFPE involves “institutional and procedural norms that guarantee all people equal opportunity for consideration in decision-making” [28]. It requires that “stakeholder and expert deliberation [be] given equal weight” and “guarantee[s] citizens and environmental stakeholders … the same rights to consent, due process, and compensation that medical patients have” [28-29].

Although Shrader-Frechette doesn’t always clearly distinguish these two components from each other (e.g., compensation is mentioned in the initial description of both components, though it is discussed only as a type of distributive injustice thereafter) or explicate them in as much detail as professional philosophers might like (e.g., there is no discussion of what “equal opportunity for consideration” or giving parties’ deliberations “equal weight” would amount to), this turns out not to be very important in the discussion of particular cases. In the cases she considers, most violations of the PPFPE fall into two categories: failure to obtain informed consent from those put at risk and/or harmed by environmental policies (participative injustice) and failure to compensate these parties adequately for the increased risk/harm they endure (distributive injustice).

Drawing on principles found in medical ethics, Shrader-Frechette argues that it is unethical to expose people to environmental hazards without first obtaining their free and informed consent. Her understanding of what it is for consent to be free and informed is a fairly standard one: consenters must have all relevant information concerning the risks/harms; they must be capable of understanding that information and bringing it to bear on their decision-making; they must not be coerced; and they must be competent to make autonomous decisions [77]. With these requirements in place, she goes on to show us case after case where they are not met.

In the case of a proposed uranium enrichment plant to be built in rural Louisiana, for example, she finds that the site selection process withheld important information from residents (about the selection criteria the company was using, about the nature of the facility, about the risks posed by the facility, and about alternatives to the facility), that the information residents were given about the risks posed by the facility wasn’t accurate, that the site selection process didn’t include residents from communities most likely to be affected by the facility, and that the area was one of “severely depressed socioeconomic conditions” and low levels of education [77-81]. She argues that because local residents lacked both important pieces of information and the education necessary to interpret the information they did have, because some were excluded from the process altogether, and because those who were included had to deliberate under conditions of economic need so severe as to be considered coercive, they can’t be said to have given free and informed consent.

We find similar stories throughout the book. In Department of Energy (DOE) nuclear facilities, workers weren’t told of their radiation exposure levels, and safety violations in their workplaces were covered up by plant managers [157-161]. The Mescalero Apache, asked to allow a nuclear waste storage facility on their land, were subject to coercion by severe economic need and threats made against those who opposed accepting the waste [126-128]. The nuclear waste storage facility to be built at Yucca Mountain in Nevada was not consented to by those who would be put at risk by it. Members of future generations cannot consent (since they do not exist), and current residents of Nevada are vehemently opposed to the project [105-110].

The other type of environmental injustice cited frequently by Shrader-Frechette is the failure to compensate those put at risk or harmed by environmental hazards. For example, in a Texas community with toxic waste seeping up through cracks in the sidewalk, the government initially rejected a proposed buyout of the victims’ houses [7]. In DOE nuclear facilities, workers have not received wage increases proportional to increased estimates of their risk (and so the Compensating Wage Differential defense of increased worker risk in this case fails) [149, 157]. And in the case of Yucca Mountain, any victims of radiation exposure are only entitled to partial compensation as a matter of law [111-112].

Shrader-Frechette is at her best when analyzing the methods used to distort or conceal important information. As she has elsewhere (see, e.g., her Risk Analysis and Scientific Method), she shows the many ways in which data can be manipulated to give the appearance of supporting certain conclusions. Here we see these techniques used to mask racial disparities in proximity to environmental hazards and even to conceal the existence of the hazards themselves [15, 25]. She also shows how environmental impact assessments can minimize the apparent costs of environmentally risky endeavors by failing to consider certain kinds of costs in their analysis (e.g., omitting, in assessing offshore drilling projects, the costs from oil spills borne by coastal communities [40]), or by discounting future costs (e.g., representing the costs of future deaths and cleanup from nuclear waste leaks as zero, thus making nuclear energy look cheap [86]).

Professional philosophers may find this book frustrating to read at times. Some of the formulations are a bit more casual than one would like. For example, Shrader-Frechette defines the Environmental Justice Movement as “the attempt to equalize the burdens of pollution, noxious development, and resource depletion” [6]. But mere equalization can’t be the aim, since that could be achieved by raising pollution levels to make everyone suffer as much as those who currently suffer most, a result that would not please Environmental Justice advocates. She also claims that “[t]he most basic assumption underlying all land-use planning is that land, as a natural resource, ought to serve equality rather than inequality, justice rather than injustice” [50]. Though many of us wish it were, this just isn’t true – land-use planning is still largely driven by the value of economic productivity, a fact to which many of the cases in her book attest. We are also told that “[p]eople often fail to engage in [Environmental Justice] advocacy because they wrongly believe they ought to remain neutral. They frequently believe that whatever scholarship or action is not wholly neutral also is not objective and therefore is biased or subjective in a reprehensible way” [194]. Taken at face-value, this is quite an implausible claim. Ordinary people don’t, for example, refuse to vote or sign petitions because they believe that one should strive for neutrality on political matters. There are plausible claims in the neighborhood of what she says here: there may be some people (e.g., political scientists, EPA officials, judges, etc.) who think that neutrality on issues of environmental justice is required of them for professional reasons, and people in general might worry about taking sides on these matters because they don’t trust advocates on either side to give them unbiased (and thus, they might think, accurate) information. But neither of these is the claim we actually find Shrader-Frechette making. In one sense, all of these problems are minor – a matter of changing a word here or there – and other parts of the book make it clear that she doesn’t believe what she seems to be asserting in these places. But on page after page, passages such as these give readers ample opportunity to exercise their interpretive skills, and this can make for slow going.

It should also be noted that, as helpful an analysis as this book provides, it does not in the end deliver everything it promises in the first chapter. Chapter One tries to situate the book within the larger field of environmental ethics. Here Shrader-Frechette presents herself as offering an alternative to biocentric and ecocentric views: “Contrary to environmental fascists and misanthropic biocentrists, this book argues that protection for people and the planet go hand in hand” [5]. Unfortunately, the book makes no such argument. The charges of misanthropy made against biocentric/ecocentric views come from the way that they handle conflicts between the interests of people and the interests of other things (plants, nonhuman animals, ecosystems, etc.). Views on which the more vital interests of people tend to lose out, e.g., those that say it’s ok to kill people to save ecosystems, are open to charges of misanthropy. There are a number of ways that a theorist might try to avoid this problem: by denying that other living things have interests, by denying that their interests ever do conflict with ours, or by claiming that people’s interests – or at least their vital interests – always take precedence in cases of conflict. The environmental ethics literature is filled with attempts to run all of these lines of argument. But Shrader-Frechette’s book has nothing at all to say about conflicts between the interests of people and other living things. In the absence of that, one can’t really see this book as an argument for an alternative view about how to handle such conflicts.

But surely this is an asset. The debates about biocentrism and ecocentrism are well-worn at this point. Issues of environmental justice, on the other hand, have been the subject of remarkably little philosophical discussion. This is especially surprising since problems of environmental justice raise so many interesting philosophical questions: What sorts of environmental conditions, if any, do people have rights to? Against whom can these rights be claimed (polluters, the government, those who reap benefits from the hazards imposed on others, etc.)? Should people be compensated for risks imposed on them or only for actual harms? What understanding of racism is implicit in the concept of environmental racism and what response to it is called for? To what extent should we be willing to make sacrifices in human health for the sake of financial prosperity or sacrifices in political/economic equality for the sake of economic development? To what extent do consumers in developed countries bear responsibility for hazardous working conditions in the developing world? Shrader-Frechette’s book begins to address these questions, and for this reason it is a valuable contribution to the literature, regardless of whether it has anything to do with biocentrism or ecocentrism.

Overall, this book is an example of precisely the type of practical ethics one hopes to see more of. The author takes seriously the need to give arguments and consider objections, but she also takes a very detailed approach to the cases she considers. Clearly a lot of research went into this book. (Partly for that reason, a bibliography would have been quite helpful.) The cases here aren’t just illustrations of more general philosophical points – they’re interesting in their own right. Very few philosophers, even those of us who do practical ethics, take the time to work through the details of cases in the way that Shrader-Frechette does in this book. It is a must-read for anyone interested in environmental justice and accessible enough that it would make a valuable addition to any undergraduate environmental ethics syllabus.