Environmental Skill: Motivation, Knowledge, and the Possibility of a Non-Romantic Environmental Ethics

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Mark Coeckelbergh, Environmental Skill: Motivation, Knowledge, and the Possibility of a Non-Romantic Environmental Ethics, Routledge, 2015, 227pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138885578.

Reviewed by Tara Kennedy


We are inundated with information about the various environmental crises we face, and many of us profess a desire to live more environmentally ethical lives. Yet the majority of us do not make significantly meaningful changes to our lifestyles, the lifestyles responsible for those very crises. How are we to account for this incongruity between what we claim to care about and our motivation to act in ways that reflect such concern, that is, between knowledge and desire on the one hand and action on the other? This is the question with which Mark Coeckelbergh opens his investigation into the possibility of an effective environmental ethics. The problem, he says, is that our current approaches to environmental ethics are rooted in a modern worldview characterized by Enlightenment rationalism and Romanticism. Calling for a focus on practical, embodied knowledge (know-how) as opposed to theoretical knowledge (knowing-that), Coeckelbergh argues instead for a non-modern virtue ethics of skilled engagement in the environment.

In the first chapter, Coeckelbergh lays out the problem of motivation, taking pains to avoid putting the reader on the defensive by pointing out how widespread the problem is, affecting even the author himself. Following this, Part I focuses on both old and new approaches to motivation and morality. To that end, the second chapter explores Socratic and Platonic explanations for morally unacceptable behavior, and the third examines theories from contemporary psychology regarding how motivation can be promoted or inhibited. In both chapters, those theories that focus on the need for theoretical knowledge as a solution to immorality are criticized on the grounds that they fail to see the need for a different kind of knowledge. He also dismisses those that assume the problem to be one of insufficient self-control, arguing that the desire for greater control is a symptom of modernity and, in fact, part of the problem. Theories that emphasize habit and direct experience find some agreement from Coeckelbergh, though he thinks that training our sights on the individual alone is insufficient. Rather, we need to understand the societal and cultural forces that shape an individual's relationship to the world around her.

In light of this, Part II investigates the ways in which modern culture contributes to our inability to make meaningful changes to our environmental habits despite our extensive knowledge of the problems we face on that front. As mentioned, Coeckelbergh sees Enlightenment rationalism and Romanticism as the forefathers of contemporary environmentalism. This makes for an unfortunate family tree because both traditions alienate us from the environment and therefore make impossible any serious ethical engagement with it. Environmental ethics reveals its Enlightenment side when it attempts to lend credibility to its claims by turning to science for justification. Far from improving the state of environmentalism, we are doomed to failure as environmentalists when we allow thought and action to be guided by the scientific notion that humans are subjective egos standing over and against a world of objects awaiting manipulation and control. Just as problematic are the beliefs, following Romanticism, that it is up to the human being to "re-enchant" nature with meaning and that the good life involves a turning away from society and towards "authenticity" and "the natural."

If contemporary environmentalism is fundamentally flawed due to its regrettable lineage, what we need, Coeckelbergh argues, is an environmental ethics that is non-modern. He investigates the possibility of this in the following three chapters, which make up Part III. He begins chapter 6 with a discussion of Heidegger's answer to the alienation engendered by the technological scientific worldview, namely the notion that we are being-in-the-world, that is, relational beings embedded in a world of other entities that is always already there. When we deny this, as we do when we envision ourselves as masterful manipulators of the objective world, we participate in enframing, Heidegger's name for that worldview that sees the environment and the objects that populate it as standing reserve, mere resources to be optimized. Although Heidegger's phenomenological insights into our relatedness open the door to a non-modern environmental ethics, Coeckelbergh ultimately criticizes him for falling prey to Romanticism. Building on what he sees as promising in Heidegger's work, however, Coeckelbergh argues that an effective environmental ethics will, among other things, recognize that our being-in-the-world with others gives rise to a responsibility to see to the flourishing of ourselves and the entities in our environment. Moreover, such an ethics will recognize that meaningfulness in the environment is not the result of humankind's efforts to "re-enchant" it but instead arises in the interplay between us and a world that pushes back against our attempts to project intelligibility onto it. In chapter 7, Coeckelbergh returns to a Socratic claim examined in chapter 2, according to which being good is a matter of knowing the good. He suggests that perhaps this claim is right after all if we understand the knowledge in question to be practical rather than theoretical, which calls on us to develop our moral know-how through habit and practice. By exploring recent work on "skilled engagement," he shows how such an understanding of ethical responsibility avoids the pitfalls of alienation, nihilism, and enframing. Lastly, in chapter 8, Coeckelbergh suggests that this approach to morality takes the form of a virtue ethics that emphasizes skill over reason and deliberation.

In the final section, Coeckelbergh examines what an environmental ethics based on non-modern skilled engagement with the environment would mean for our concrete practices. For example, in chapter 9 he discusses the notion of walking in nature, important for the Romantic tradition, and makes suggestions regarding the form such walking might take for the non-modern virtue ethicist he envisions. Chapter 10 comprises a selection of similar, albeit shorter, examinations of how his non-modern ethical position would call on us to understand a variety of aspects of our daily life: healthcare, food, animals, energy, and climate change. Because of the ubiquity of technology and the role it plays in shaping our lives, Coeckelbergh devotes chapter 11 to an investigation of how we might relate to information and communication technologies were we to adopt the sort of virtue ethics he favors. He is keen to dismiss the Romantic rejection of technology, arguing that the ethics he defends is instead an opportunity to examine our ways of relating to the environment, which are always mediated by technology. Such an openness to technology, guided by his non-modern version of virtue ethics, may even "open up new opportunities for skilled engagement" (9). Finally, drawing on work he has done elsewhere, Coeckelbergh uses the last chapter to alert us to the difficulty inherent in trying to shift our ethical practices, conditioned as they always are by factors not wholly within our control, among them language, bodies, and spirituality.

There is much for contemporary environmentalists to find compelling about Coeckelbergh's account, being not only an interesting analysis of the factors at work in motivation but also a convincing and optimistic approach to the problem. Despite his claims to part ways with Heidegger, even those environmentalists who would describe themselves as post-Heideggerian can, I think, find much with which to agree. This is, in part, because Coeckelbergh's interpretation of Heidegger is, in some cases, inaccurate. When corrected, his views can be seen as very Heideggerian indeed. Coeckelbergh's overall criticism of Heidegger is that he wanders off into Romantic territory at times, ruining his chances of becoming our environmentally ethical exemplar. For example, he relies on Heidegger's early work in order to argue that the thinker's writings demonstrate a Romantic emphasis on the authenticity of the individual. While this is a theme of Being and Time, post-Heideggerian environmentalists do well to focus on his later work where he characterizes Western metaphysics as ontotheology and emphasizes the inexhaustible meaningfulness of being as such. Without these later concepts, his criticisms of technology and enframing, indispensable to his appropriation by most post-Heideggerian environmental ethicists, lack a basis.[1] Yet the development of his thought on enframing and technology is a direct result of his abandonment of the main project of Being and Time, that of constructing a fundamental ontology. Thus it is problematic to rely on that text to evaluate his success in environmental ethics.

Coeckelbergh also claims that in expressing a preference for an old windmill over a hydroelectric power plant, Heidegger ultimately requires us "to choose between either rational thinking or poetic thinking, between technology and beauty" (86). This reading of Heidegger also reveals his supposed Romantic side in the sense that nostalgia for the "natural" is one of the characteristics of the tradition, a feature that in some forms appears as a rejection of modern technology. Heidegger, however, is clear that technê is a form of poiêsis.[2] In its acceptable form, technê allows us to make our way in the world, a way which, at times, calls for us to treat other entities as a resource. Thus, as meditative but embodied beings, it would be impossible for us to choose between poetry and technology. Rather, Heidegger's preference for the old windmill may have more to do with the range and efficiency of different technologies in their ability to treat entities as resources. The greater and more rapid their reach, the more likely that technê will take on a grotesque form, in which ontological disclosure is distorted into "imposure". His views, then, while seemingly nostalgic, do not require a renunciation of technology. Instead, we can remain alert to the danger in using technological devices and choose to maintain a relationship to them in which we use them as tools without becoming ourselves the tools of enframing. This accords well with Coeckelbergh's analysis of technology, where he argues that the key to determining the ethical permissibility of various technologies lies in the way in which the user allows technological devices to condition his relationship to the environment.

There are a handful of other places in which Heideggerians might take issue with Coeckelbergh's reading of him. When, for example, Coeckelbergh interprets Heidegger as maintaining a distinction between "nature" and humankind, his supporters might wish to respond by pointing out the ways in which, as a phenomenologist, Heidegger's thought actually works to free us of the traditional dichotomies that accompany our problematic modern worldview, among them the nature-humankind dichotomy and the subject-object dichotomy. When he suggests that Heidegger thinks that "nature should be left to itself, that we should not intervene in nature," his supporters might counter that while humankind ought not to consider everything available for our manipulation, we nevertheless may play a role in poiêsis (167). Consider Heidegger's admiration for the poet and the farmer, both of whom play an important role in the poetic emergence of ontological possibility, in all kinds of environments. Ultimately, though, these points of disagreement with Heidegger do not undermine Coeckelbergh's effectiveness in articulating a compelling account of the problem of motivation and how the development of an ethics of skilled engagement with the environment, a focus on habit and virtue, would find us better equipped to deal with the environmental crises we face. It is a welcome and interesting addition to a field in need of voices focused on bringing about meaningful, practical change.

[1] For a comprehensive discussion of the importance of ontotheology in Heidegger's thought, see Iain Thomson, Heidegger on Ontotheology, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005.

[2] See Martin Heidegger, "The Question Concerning Technology" in The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays, William Lovitt (tr.), page 13.