Epicureanism at the Origins of Modernity

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Catherine Wilson, Epicureanism at the Origins of Modernity, Oxford University Press, 2008, 304pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199238811.

Reviewed by Margaret J. Osler, University of Calgary


The restoration of Epicurean atomism and hedonism was an important feature of philosophy in the seventeenth century. Epicurean atomism was one of several traditions that influenced the development of the mechanical philosophy, and its hedonism contributed to the development of political philosophies incorporating theories of social contract. In her new book, constructed from a number of previously-published articles, Catherine Wilson wants to demonstrate "how the theory of atoms, and the political contractualism and ethical hedonism that were conceptually bound to it, were addressed, adopted, and battled against by the canonical philosophers of the period." (v) She wants further "to establish that an intellectually compelling and robust tradition took materialism as the only valid frame of reference, not only for scientific inquiry but for the deepest problems of ethics and politics." (v) She adopts De rerum natura, the Roman poet Lucretius' (94-55 BC) poetic exposition of the philosophy of Epicurus (341-270 BC), as the framework for her argument. Accordingly, she deals with the role key Epicurean doctrines, such as an atomic theory of matter, the absence of gods and providence from the world, the mortality of the soul, and ethical hedonism, played in the thinking and writing of several key seventeenth-century philosophers. She devotes her longest discussions to Pierre Gassendi (1592-1655), René Descartes (1596-1650), Robert Boyle (1627-1691), and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716). Although she never says exactly what she means by 'modernity' -- the currently ubiquitous term that eludes definition and should be gone with the wind like the vexed, essentialist terms 'Renaissance' and 'Enlightenment' -- the book's thesis seems to be that modernity arose from the Epicurean preoccupations of seventeenth-century philosophers, notably their godless materialism and their endorsement of empirical and experimental knowledge, and their articulation of a totally secular political philosophy based on the notion of the social contract, developments that Wilson cheers.

A good history of Epicureanism in early modern thought would be a welcome addition to the existing literature. Unfortunately, this is a gap that Wilson's book does not fill. It suffers from a number of problems -- some systemic and some detailed -- that undermine its reliability. Her view of seventeenth-century issues is blinkered because she restricts her analysis to an account of philosophers who hold a place in the modern canon of the history of philosophy. This limitation coupled with a tendency to make anachronistic judgments prevents her from examining the abundance of alternatives that competed with Epicureanism in seventeenth-century philosophy. Further, she neglects to consider other traditions -- such as late Scholasticism, alchemy, Renaissance humanism, Copernican astronomy, and Galileo's new science of motion -- that contributed directly to the development of a corpuscularian philosophy and an empirical and experimental approach to natural knowledge. Her own patently intolerant attitude towards theology prevents her from understanding that theological presuppositions were virtually axiomatic for most of the philosophers of the period. Their lengthy arguments for the immortality of the soul, for example, were aimed at correcting the errors they found in the writings of Pietro Pompanazzi (1462-1525) as well as in Epicureanism, even if those arguments are not convincing by modern standards. They were not, as she claims time after time, acts of subterfuge created to avoid official condemnation. Equally, Wilson's uncritical endorsement of a materialistic account of the natural world prevents her from seeking a genuinely historical explanation for the appeal of the mechanical philosophy to seventeenth-century thinkers. Her account reads almost like the old histories of science that explained the development of the sciences in terms of the unrolling of their internal logic. What this approach lacks is an understanding of the role of historical contingencies, interests, and assumptions, often ones that we no longer find acceptable, in leading thinkers to adopt the positions they did and which also have influenced our own views. Even if we could know that our present theories are correct, seventeenth-century philosophers could not possibly have known that they were creating modernity.

Many of the book's flaws flow from the narrow range of Wilson's definition of philosophy, a neglect of much recent scholarship, and what I can only call a perverse reading of some of the texts. Consider her treatment of Gassendi, a Roman Catholic priest and Canon of the Cathedral at the Provençal town of Digne, who devoted much of his life to restoring the philosophy of Epicurus to make it acceptable to Christian thinkers. Although he accepted atoms and the void as the ultimate components of the physical world, he explicitly rejected the aspects of Epicureanism offensive to orthodox Christianity: polytheism, a corporeal conception of the divine nature, the negation of all providence, the denial of creation ex nihilo, the infinitude and eternity of atoms and the universe, the plurality of worlds, the attribution of the cause of the world to chance, a materialistic cosmogony, the denial of all finality in biology, and the corporeality and mortality of the human soul. Gassendi replaced these doctrines with a Christianized atomism which asserted the creation of the world and its constituent atoms by a wise and all powerful God who rules the world providentially, the existence of a large but finite number of atoms in a single world, the evidence of design throughout the creation, a role for final causes in natural philosophy, and the immortality and immateriality of the human soul. He devoted many pages of his massive Syntagma Philosophicum, published posthumously in 1658, to establish these points.

Wilson presents Gassendi's theory of the human soul as evidence that he was at heart a materialist, albeit a materialist in the closet. She mentions "Gassendi's attacks on the incorporeal soul" (p. 127), without providing any textual evidence for that unsupportable claim. In another passage, she refers to his "negative attitude toward theology and scholastic philosophy" (95) as more prominent in his thinking than his commitment to voluntarist theology -- a commitment I have documented at length in Divine Will and the Mechanical Philosophy (1994). Wilson's claim has no support in Gassendi's text. He argued at length for the existence of a creator who rules the world with intelligence and providence. Following Lucretius, he claimed that humans possess two souls. The material soul, called the anima, which is responsible for the vital functions of the organism and basic functions of motion and perception, is also present in animals. In addition, humans possess a rational soul, or animus. Explicitly rejecting Lucretius' claim that the rational soul is material, Gassendi argued at length for its immateriality and immortality, a common seventeenth-century approach. Wilson dismisses these arguments because they are not demonstratively certain. But she fails to note the instructions of the Fifth Lateran Council of 1513 (cited by both Gassendi and his English expositor Walter Charleton), which established the immortality of the soul as official dogma and asked Christian philosophers to "use all their powers" to demonstrate that the immortality of the soul can be known by natural reason, not by faith alone. The Council was reacting to Pompanazzi's explicit denial of immortality. That Gassendi's arguments for the immortality of the soul were not metaphysically certain reflected his mitigated skepticism, according to which humans can at best achieve high probability. He thought that conjecture and probability characterized all human knowledge. Faith, of course, was another matter.

In addition to his discussions of God's role in the world and the immortality of the human soul, Gassendi's theology played a central role in his ethics and political philosophy. As Lisa Sarasohn has demonstrated in Gassendi's Ethics (1996), Gassendi adopted the hedonistic ethics of Epicurus, which sought to maximize pleasure and minimize pain, reinterpreting the concept of pleasure in a distinctly Christian way. He believed that God endowed humans with free will and an innate desire for pleasure. Thus, by utilizing the calculus of pleasure and pain and by exercising their ability to make free choices, they participate in God's providential plans for creation. The greatest pleasure humans can attain is the beatific vision of God after death, a pleasure which they can attain because of God's providence. Based on his hedonistic ethics, Gassendi's political philosophy was a theory of social contract and influenced the writings of Hobbes and Locke. This Christianized hedonism is hardly the sort of libertinism that Wilson ascribes to the influence of Epicureanism on early modern ethical and political thought. Elsewhere in the "Ethics", in an extended discussion of fortune, fate, and divination -- concepts he reinterpreted in Christian terms -- Gassendi argued against what he saw as Democritean and Hobbesian hard determinism, a discussion in which he explicitly addressed the vexed relationship between divine foreknowledge and human free will, a topic that was of central importance during this post-Reformation period.

Wilson's discussion of the mechanical philosopher and chemist Robert Boyle suffers from an incomplete reading of both his own writings and the wealth of recent scholarship about him. The sources of Boyle's philosophy of nature are far more complex than Wilson suggests. Although it is true that he adopted many ideas from Gassendi's baptized version of Epicureanism, other traditions played a prominent role in his thinking. As Lawrence M. Principe and William R. Newman have argued in Alchemy Tried in the Fire (2002), it was his early contact with the American alchemist George Starkey (1628-1665) that taught Boyle his careful experimental approach to chemistry and initiated his interest in alchemy. Boyle's first approach to chemistry came from the works of the Belgian chemist J.- B. Van Helmont (1579-1644), who worked within a Paracelsian tradition. Van Helmont's influence remains evident throughout Boyle's chemical writings. Furthermore, as Newman has argued in Atoms and Alchemy: Chymistry and the Experimental Origins of the Scientific Revolution, corpuscularian theories of matter were developed in both the alchemical and Aristotelian traditions, leaving their marks on the matter theories adopted by seventeenth-century chemists. Consequently, the ascription of Boyle's corpuscularianism to Epicurean atomism alone is an over-simplification that does not do justice to the historical facts.

As for Boyle's theology, which occupies at least as many pages in his voluminous writings as his works on chemistry, Wilson resists accepting the fact that he and many of his contemporaries could have really been motivated by his religious beliefs. Instead of reading his works in the context of seventeenth-century theological and philosophical controversies and instead of consulting the wealth of scholarship coming from a thriving Boyle industry, she relies uncritically on the psychoanalytic hypotheses of a few very speculative works. Her own inability to take seriously the fact that theology was inseparable from seventeenth-century natural philosophy has produced an extremely distorted reading of Boyle's works. He was a voluntarist, and deeply opposed to deism, views he elaborated in many works, notably in his Free Inquiry into the Vulgarly Received Notion of Nature (1687). He believed in the immortality of the human soul, which he thought God infused into each individual during gestation. And he wrote repeatedly of the fate of the soul after death and, then, at the time of the final judgment and the general resurrection. He accepted the existence of angels and demons, a belief made manifest when he refused the offer, which sorely tempted him, to serve as a reader of crystal balls, a task for which his proclaimed virginity qualified him, because he feared that he might encounter the wrong kind of spirits if he did. There is no concrete evidence that he was toying with deism or wracked by spiritual conflict.

Wilson devotes an entire chapter to what she calls "Rival Systems", but her discussion is confined to the ideas of the canonical philosophers Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz and George Berkeley and their reactions to Epicurean atomism. But what about other systems that populated the luxurious philosophical landscape of the seventeenth century? What about the followers of Paracelsus, whose chemical ideas probably played a larger role in the later development of chemistry than the mechanical philosophy? What about Henry More's Platonism? What about alchemy, to which both Robert Boyle and Isaac Newton appealed, at least in part, to eliminate the specters of materialism and deism that they saw haunting the mechanical philosophy? Each of these worldviews and others influenced the further development of philosophy and the sciences. It is only an anachronistic judgment, based on a commitment to materialism, experimentalism, and analytic philosophy, that narrows the significance of the history of this period to the expositors and detractors of Epicureanism.

Because the book suffers from both a shortage of connective tissue binding the separate chapters into an organic whole and a general conclusion, there are problems of organization and unity. Wilson organizes her chapters around the topics presented in Lucretius' epic, De rerum natura, and she frequently compares the ideas of her early modern thinkers with passages of Lucretius' poem. In most cases she does not establish that the early modern individual was actually responding to Lucretius directly rather than to some Renaissance or seventeenth-century exposition of his ideas. As a result the book does not really hang together as a sustained argument.

Wilson's book is interesting in that it raises important questions about what the history of philosophy should be. While her approach is not quite the dialogue across the ages characteristic of many analytic histories of philosophy and while she has read widely in the texts of early modern philosophy, her book often seems to be an argument in favor of materialism, corpuscularianism, the experimental method, and the social contract rather than a nuanced understanding of her early modern thinkers. She gives high marks to philosophers who adopt these attitudes; she seems to ridicule and dismiss those who retain religious and theological views.

History, especially history of philosophy, must attend closely to context if it is to reveal more about the historical figures than the historian herself.