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Tim O'Keefe, Epicureanism, Acumen, 2010, 206pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651702.

Reviewed by David Konstan, Brown University



In a word, this is a splendid book. As an introduction to all aspects of ancient Epicureanism, addressed to a general readership with an interest in the history of philosophy, I cannot imagine anything better. I shall recommend it to students and colleagues as the first place to go for an engaging, clear, thoughtful, and informed overview of the subject. It is written clearly and entertainingly, and presents the major issues in Epicurean physics, epistemology, and ethics in a stimulating way, setting the arguments in the context of ancient philosophical debates and summarizing the arguments — and their cogency — both for and against the Epicurean positions. O’Keefe has a thorough mastery of the texts, and has thought through their larger implication. He offers new insights here and there and makes his own contributions to our understanding of the doctrines, so that the book will be of interest even to specialists. In all, it is a pleasure to read.

The book is in three parts and seventeen chapters, the first of which is an introduction to Epicurus’ life and school. Part I, on “Metaphysics and Physics” (the collocation is significant), includes chapters on atoms and void, atomic motion, sensible qualities, cosmology, biology and language, the mind, and freedom and determinism. The second part, on “Epistemology”, has a chapter on scepticism and another on the canon. Finally, Part III, on “Ethics”, offers chapters on pleasure as the end, the varieties of pleasure, the virtues, justice, friendship, the gods, and, reserved for last, death.

Inevitably, there are some technical points on which I disagree with O’Keefe, which may be worth pointing out, despite the introductory character of his book. This is not to say that O’Keefe is obliged to agree with me — it may well be my views that are idiosyncratic — nor, even if he should agree, that these issues ought to be raised in a book of this sort. But readers of this review may want to know where certain matters are open to an alternative interpretation, and may welcome a few examples.

My first point of difference concerns the treatment of minima. Epicurean atoms all move at the same velocity, and this must be one minimum of space in a minimum of time; O’Keefe puts the matter a little misleadingly when he suggests that this is their “fastest speed” (p. 23), and occurs when they move unimpeded through empty space, though it is true that they will cover the greatest one-directional distance in a given period of time under such conditions. But the bigger issue is how a doctrine of minima can be squared with elementary geometry, according to which the side and the diagonal of a square (or cube) are incommensurable. O’Keefe writes (p. 24): “But if magnitudes are composed of a whole number of spatial minima, it follows that all magnitudes are commensurable with one another,” and tant pis for geometry. Now, I have argued that minima do not work this way; rather, they are something like infinitesimals, that is, the inverse of the order of magnitude that Epicurus calls “the not strictly finite but only the incomprehensibly large” (Letter to Herodotus 42). If this is so, then summing them up to a finite length, such as the side or diagonal of a square, would require an incomprehensibly large number of minima, and when dealing with such quantities, the ordinary laws of mathematics need not apply, any more than they do in modern analyses of infinite and infinitesimal magnitudes. I must acknowledge that my view is hardly the most common one, and O’Keefe was not obliged to recognize it in a book like this.1

Why do atoms constantly move? O’Keefe invokes the property of weight, which Epicurus added to the Democritean theory as an attribute of atoms (pp. 25-32). But this would explain, if anything, why they move in the direction “down”, not why they move at all. Suppose an atom is coursing upwards, as a result of a collision: it cannot slow down; nor is there any reason why it should suddenly change its direction of motion by 180 degrees. It is this problem that led me to propose that weight, for Epicurus, is rather the average tendency of atoms to emerge from collisions in a privileged direction: think of the resultant of all the atomic motions as a small vector, that always points the same way. That direction is “down”, by definition, and it is simply an elementary feature of nature. The swerve was invoked by the Epicureans to explain why atoms that are all moving downward at a uniform speed would ever begin to collide. O’Keefe explains (p. 30): "The swerve does not get collisions started; instead, it explains why the atoms have been eternally colliding." This avoids postulating a beginning state in a universe presumed to be eternal, but perhaps there is another reason for the Epicurean thesis. If it is true that there is an inherent tendency for atoms to emerge from collisions in a single direction, however small that differential might be from random rebounds, then the Epicureans may have worried that, at some point, atoms would all be moving downward, and collisions would stop. The hypothesis of the swerve eliminates this possibility.

On the question of language, O’Keefe affirms (p. 58): “The Epicureans would admit that there is typically a level of complexity and self-awareness in human speech lacking in dog yelps but deny any radical distinction in the sense in which the two are meaningful”; that is, they do not recognize the distinction between what Paul Grice calls “natural meaning” and “linguistic meaning”. But the word “death” is not an expression of a physical state in the way that the bark of a dog may be the expression of pain; it is crucial that human language is the vehicle for beliefs, which may be true or false (or “empty”, in the preferred Epicurean locution). Just for this reason, human beings may entertain a fear of death, which it is the purpose of Epicureanism to eliminate. The fear is perfectly real, although it is “empty”; that is, its object is not something genuinely frightening. Dogs would be subject to such mistaken beliefs only if they had a human kind of language (the difference, I would argue, is not simply a matter of the ability to reason, pp. 66-67). Thus, I also disagree with O’Keefe on the proposition that “Animals have beliefs, as we do” (p. 94). If they did, they could have false ones, and hence empty fears and all the rest, but it is hard to imagine that animals are in need of Epicurean therapy.

I have always rather liked the Epicurean view that you confirm the validity of judgments based on the senses (“that’s a round tower in the distance”) by taking a closer look; the consequence is that, when you cannot do so, as with astronomical phenomena, it is best not to decide between competing plausible explanations. O’Keefe may be right that “This reticence is partly due to an admirable intellectual humility,” and partly to “a deep incuriosity” (p. 105). But above all, I think, it reflects the Epicureans’ worry that a need for certainty in these matters will open the door to belief in divine causation. O’Keefe might have mentioned here Epicurus’ odd insistence that the sun is about the size it appears (he notes this on p. 43, in the chapter on cosmology): why take a firm view on this point, of all things? David Furley once suggested that it was in response to the discovery that a solar eclipse in Greece was seen at a different time of day than it was in Egypt, which meant that the shadows cast at a given time would be at different angles in the two places. The most natural explanation for this phenomenon was that the earth was round; since the Epicureans maintained that it was flat and disk-shaped (this was, I believe, crucial to their theory of gravity, as distinct from atomic weight), they needed to posit a nearby and point-like source of light.2

Of course, Epicureans maintain that all creatures naturally seek pleasure and avoid pain; people fail to do so because they have false beliefs about things, and as a result, are driven by irrational fears and desires. O’Keefe remarks (p. 117): "The first distinction Epicurus makes is between mental and bodily pleasures and pains. In some sense, of course, all pleasures and pains are mental, in so far as one has to have a mind in order to experience them." This is true, but disguises an important distinction: for Epicurus, the mind is divided into two parts, one rational (logikon), with which we think and hold beliefs, the other non-rational (alogon), which is what registers sensations and physical pleasures and pains (Lucretius designates these parts animus and anima). Fears, which depend on beliefs, are located in the rational part, and so too (I maintain) is joy or khara. Now, if ataraxy, that is, the tranquillity that results from freedom from fear, is pleasurable, as the Epicureans maintain (it is a static rather than a mobile pleasure, but pleasure all the same), where is that pleasure located? My guess is that it is registered throughout the psyche, but it is a point about which I am still in doubt; I would have liked to see O’Keefe’s thoughts on this question.

The Epicureans sought to free people from irrational fears and desires, for example, the pursuit of wealth and power beyond what is necessary for a comfortable life. The latter is not so much a matter of “desire-reduction” as a consequence of not holding the irrational beliefs which lead to such desires (p. 124). O’Keefe observes that “vain and empty desires … tend to increase without limit”, but why should this be so (p. 125)? I believe part of the reason is that people somehow believe, as Lucretius puts it, that poverty is the antechamber to Hades (3.63-69), and so seek to accumulate ever more as a way of protecting themselves against the fear of death. (O’Keefe does note elsewhere that “acquisitive attitudes and the fear of death are closely entwined” [p. 173].) There is thus a subtle psychological dynamic at work. But the kind of insight required to eliminate such fears is not easy to acquire. O’Keefe is right to point out that the Epicureans relied on certain rituals to help maintain the convictions on which ataraxy depends (p. 136). I would have added here a reference to Philodemus’ partially preserved treatise, On Frank Speech (Peri parrhêsias), as an illustration of the Epicureans’ awareness of how difficult it is to educate people in philosophy (O’Keefe does refer to this work on p. 148); one must look to social position, gender, and other factors in finding the best way to promote the pursuit of wisdom in each individual, without being too indulgent or pushing the aspirant too hard. This reflects not so much an indifference to the validity of arguments, so long as they are effective in instilling the right beliefs, as the consciousness that their doctrines are hard to accept and the teacher must be sensitive and patient (p. 135). Plato and Aristotle would not necessarily have objected to such a pedagogical strategy (cf. Plato Republic 376-77 on the instruction of children by means of falsehoods).

The Epicureans counseled a withdrawal from political life, since it brought more trouble than it was worth (pp. 145-46). They were not, however, averse to offering advice to rulers, a point that O’Keefe might have noted. But, as O’Keefe rightly observes, the Epicureans placed an extraordinarily high value on friendship, even to the point, in some circumstances, of putting a friend’s welfare before one’s own, thereby contravening the hedonistic egoism preached by the school (p. 147). I am fairly sure that Epicurus himself, and not just later Epicureans, recognized that friendship was a value in its own right: it may have its origin in utility, but it ends up being a virtue (or “choiceworthy”, if one accepts Usener’s emendation) in itself, as Epicurus put it (Vatican Saying 23). But how is such a disposition consistent with Epicurean hedonism? There is a similar problem in connection with Epicurus’ view that it is perfectly normal to feel pain at the death of a friend (p. 171, in the chapter on death). In this connection, I would note a passage in Lucretius (2.352-56), in which he provides a moving description of the suffering that a cow experiences upon the loss of her calf: she is inconsolable, and cannot be comforted by the substitution of some other calf, since she knows her own, even to the point of recognizing its hoofprints in the ground. If loss of a dear one affects a cow in this way, then it must be at the non-rational level: it is not that the cow knows that the calf is dead (in Lucretius’ example, it does not); it simply misses its offspring. Human beings are naturally subject to the same sense of loss, which has nothing to do with fear of death. Such an instinctive attachment, then, may in part explain why human beings might even go so far as to sacrifice their life for a friend.

When it comes to the Epicurean gods, O’Keefe opts for the so-called idealist view of them, according to which the gods are “idealizations of the most blessed human life” or “thought-constructs” (p. 159). Though this is not the place to enter into a full discussion of the question, I believe that the Epicureans maintained that they were real, that is, that they exist outside ourselves, and that their immortality was guaranteed by a process of constant replenishment of lost atoms. But O’Keefe’s view has been adopted by some fine scholars, and he offers a spirited defense of it.

The considerations I have raised are not, as I remarked at the beginning, intended to detract in the least from O’Keefe’s achievement in this book. He has covered the main topics of Epicureanism with great elegance and insight, and has produced a small masterpiece.

1 In the comments that follow, I make reference to arguments that I have developed in more detail elsewhere. For the convenience of the reader, I list those items here. "Epicurus on Up and Down (Letter to Herodotus sec. 60)", Phronesis 17 (1972) 269-78; “Problems in Epicurean Physics”, Isis 70 (1979) 394-418, repr. in J.P. Anton and A. Preuss, eds., Essays in Ancient Greek Philosophy vol. 2 (Albany: SUNY Press, 1983) 431-64; "Points, Lines, and Infinity: Aristotle’s Physics Z and Hellenistic Philosophy", Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 3 (1987) 1-32; “Comment on P. J. Bicknell, ‘Why Atoms Had to Swerve: An Exploration in Epicurean Physics’”, Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium on Ancient Philosophy 6 (1990) 277-88; "Περληψις in Epicurean Epistemology", Ancient Philosophy 13 (1993) 125-37; “Ancient Atomism and its Heritage: Minimal Parts”, Ancient Philosophy 2 (1982) 60-75; “A Life Worthy of the Gods”: The Materialist Pyschology of Epicurus (Las Vegas: Parmenides Publishing, 2008); “The Gods of Epicurus”, in Jeffrey Fish and Kirk Sanders, eds., Epicurus and the Epicurean Tradition (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 2009).

2 See David Furley, “The Earth in Epicurean and Contemporary Astronomy”, in Gabriele Giannantoni and Marcello Gigante, eds., Epicureismo greco e romano: Atti del congresso internazionale, Napoli, 19-26 maggio 1993 (Naples: Bibliopolis, 1996) vol. 1: 119-25.