Epicurus and Democritean Ethics: An Archaeology of Ataraxia

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Warren, James, Epicurus and Democritean Ethics: An Archaeology of Ataraxia, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 241 pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521813697.

Reviewed by Tim O'Keefe, University of Minnesota, Morris


Epicurus’ debt to Democritus’ metaphysics is obvious. Even where Epicurus feels the need to modify Democritus’ metaphysics because of its skeptical or fatalist implications, he is working within Democritus’ general framework. The situation is quite different in ethics. Ancient critics of Epicurus claim that the Cyrenaics’ hedonism is the inspiration for his ethics, and in modern times, Epicurus’ ethics is usually viewed in the context of Aristotle’s eudaimonism.

Warren claims that we can better understand Epicurus’ eudaimonistic hedonism if we see its relationship to the ethical views of Democritus and those thinkers influenced by him. Epicurus and Democritean Ethics is a study of the ethical tradition of the Democriteans and how Epicurus responds to it. Warren acknowledges that Epicurus appropriates aspects of Democritean thought: its stand against teleology, its rejection of meddling deities, and its advocacy of peace of mind. However, Warren concentrates his attention on the ways in which Epicurus is hostile to this tradition and seeks to overcome its failings. In particular, Democritus’ assertion that only atoms and the void exist in truth, while qualities like sweetness and heat exist only ‘by convention,’ has important consequences on the ethical theories of Democritus’ followers—although not on that of Democritus himself—that Epicurus feels the need to resist. Anaxarchus and Pyrrho develop moral anti-realist positions, where values exist only ‘by convention’ and not ‘in truth,’ whereas Nausiphanes, the reviled teacher of Epicurus, does not deny the reality of values but reduces ethics to physics, claiming that knowledge of phusiologia—natural science—is sufficient for knowledge of ethics, politics, and rhetoric.

Or so Warren claims. One reason that the influence of the Democriteans’ ethical thought on Epicurus has not been much studied is because the information in this area is so sketchy. Hence, much of Warren’s archaeology involves trying to piece together ethical theories from scattered, variable, and unclear sources.

Epicurus and Democritean Ethics has many worthwhile things to say about Epicurus’ predecessors. People interested in the ethics of Democritus, Anaxarchus, Pyrrho, Timon, or Nausiphanes should certainly take a look at this book. However, some of its most important claims about the Democriteans are dubious. And in the end, Epicurus and Democritean Ethics doesn’t succeed in its larger aim of improving our understanding of Epicurus’ ethical system. I’ll consider Warren’s main claims about Epicurus’ predecessors and my reasons for doubting some of them before turning to an assessment of this study’s impact on our thinking about Epicurus’ ethics.

After a general introduction to his project and an opening chapter devoted to explaining who the ‘Democriteans’ are, why they are part of a common tradition, and what his main sources are, Warren turns to Democritus’ ethics. Following a discussion of the various terms Democritus unsystematically uses for the telos (such as euthumia, ‘cheerfulness’), Warren comes to the following tentative conclusions: Some of Democritus’ terms for the telos and the ways he describes it bear striking resemblance to the Epicurean telos of ataraxia, and many of their ethical concerns are similar, such as the stress on removing fear, particularly fear of death, and moderating the desires. Nonetheless, we cannot simply assimilate Democritus’ ethics to Epicurus’. For one thing, Democritus is not a hedonist. In addition to denying explicitly that hêdonê is the telos, Democritus distinguishes between terpsis (joy) and hêdonê (pleasure).Warren concludes that the difference between the two is that terpsis “tracks what is objectively valuable” (Warren bases this on DK B4, where terpsis is described as the boundary-marker for what is beneficial), whereas hêdonê does not. That’s because what’s pleasurable can vary from person to person, whereas the same thing is good and true for all people (B69). Furthermore, not all pleasures are beneficial (B74), and one shouldn’t choose all pleasures, but take pleasure only in what is good (B207).

Warren’s discussion here is tantalizing but ultimately unsatisfying. Even if one accepts his analysis of the difference between terpsis and hêdonê, he leaves unanswered the most important philosophical questions. For instance, Warren says that the difference between terpsis and hêdonê is not one of ‘spiritual’ vs. ‘bodily’ pleasures, respectively, but it’s not clear what exactly the difference is. Nor does he explain what it means for things to be ‘objectively valuable’ or what makes them objectively valuable. Warren may mean that one takes joy only in things that really are ultimately productive of a state of euthumia, whereas one can feel pleasure both at things that do and don’t ultimately produce such a state, but I’m not sure.

Warren says that Democritus’ discussion of the pleasures of the foolish (i.e. taking pleasures in things that are not really good for you) anticipates Epicurus’ division of desires into natural and necessary, natural but non-necessary, and vain and empty. But of course, Epicurus maintains that all pleasures are valuable per se, although not all are choiceworthy, that the pleasant life equals the eudaimôn life, and that the state of ataraxia is itself most pleasant, whereas Democritus (it seems) would deny all these claims. Warren doesn’t address the issue of why there is this radical change in the status of pleasure—if the change is indeed substantive and not merely terminological—despite these underlying similarities.

Warren also considers whether Democritus identifies the ideal state of euthumia with a certain physical arrangement of atoms. Warren looks at B191, where Democritus says that “souls moved out of large intervals are neither well settled nor euthumoi.” He argues that there are good reasons to suppose that Democritus thinks of the ‘large intervals’ here as literal physical intervals between soul atoms, but he decides in the end that Democritus’ position is unclear. This suits Warren’s overall thesis, because he proposes that the ambiguities in Democritus’ ethics are developed in different directions by different followers. So on Warren’s analysis, there is little in Democritus’ own ethical thought that Epicurus is responding to directly.

Warren’s discussion of Democritus contains much of interest, but his picture of Democritus is still quite indeterminate. I don’t endorse Jonathan Barnes’ characterization of Democritus’ ethics as simply a series a dreary homespun platitudes on how to lead an undisturbed life, with nothing of philosophical interest (530-5), since there isn’t enough evidence to justify such negative dogmatism. However, at least as characterized by Warren, it’s not clear whether Democritus has a systematic ethical theory rather than simply a number of ethical views.

In the next chapter, Warren turns to the shadowy figure of Anaxarchus, who links Democritus to Pyrrho. He came from Abdera and may have been an atomist (although the evidence only weakly points this way). He reportedly accompanied Pyrrho to India, and his impassivity and contentment earned him the epithet ‘the happiness man’ (ho eudaimonikos). Warren proposes a novel interpretation of Anaxarchus’ position.

The most important testimony on Anaxarchus’ philosophy comes from Sextus Empiricus (M 7 87-8), who says that some people report that Anaxarchus abolishes the criterion by likening real things to painted scenery and supposing them to resemble the images occurring in dreams and madness. Usually this is thought to be making the point that none of our sense-experiences are veridical (or at least that none are trustworthy). Anaxarchus may be drawing upon Democritus’ contention that none of the phenomenal qualities conveyed by the senses exist in truth.

Warren, however, gives a more restricted reading: Anaxarchus’ skepticism applies only to moral qualities, not phenomenal properties tout court. According to Warren, Anaxarchus is a moral anti-realist, where nothing is good or bad in truth, but only by convention. However, he probably still leaves perceptible qualities intact. Anaxarchus’ image of the world to a stage-painting can be fruitfully compared to the Stoic Aristo’s contention (DL 7.160) that the wise person should regard all externals as utterly indifferent and view himself as an actor merely playing a role. Warren glosses this as asserting that the external social roles are all “mask and costume,” with no real value.

I find this parallel unconvincing. Although both images are theatrical, Aristo’s metaphor concerns how we should approach our social roles, whereas Anaxarchus’ metaphor that things in the ‘real world’ are like painted scenery, along with the likening of our sensations to dreams and madness, is most naturally taken as making a wider point about our sensations generally, and Sextus introduces the image in such an epistemological context. Warren replies that this is an interpolation: later sources read skeptical epistemologies back into the remarks of predecessors of genuine skeptics like Arcesilaus and Timon. Such a distortion is possible, but then is Warren contending that the likening of the images to dreams and madness is also a later interpolation? To read this metaphor as asserting only a moral anti-realism, instead of making the wider skeptical point, would be strained.

In any case, if we are dubious about the reliability of these later reports, I see little reason to attribute to Anaxarchus a skepticism limited to values, rather than to remain entirely agnostic about his thought. Warren’s evidence for moral anti-realism in particular is that the biographical anecdotes on Anaxarchus reveal somebody mainly concerned with moral anti-realism. The stories emphasize Anaxarchus’ approval of ‘indifference,’ where this approval of ‘indifference’ is really (Warren claims) mainly indifference as to the value of external goods, not indifference as to epistemological matters. For instance, when Anaxarchus praises Pyrrho’s indifference when Pyrrho ignores Anaxarchus after he’s fallen into a pond (DL 9.63), this is most naturally read as moral indifference as to whether helping Anaxarchus really matters one way or the other, not doxastic indifference whether Anaxarchus is really in the pond or not.

Warren’s main text to support his position is Plutarch’s report of Anaxarchus’ rebuke of Alexander the Great (Plut. Alex. 52, DK A3). Alexander is distraught after hearing of the death of a man at his orders. Anaxarchus replies that standing in fear of the censure and laws of men and being enslaved by empty opinion would be foolish. After all, Alexander, with his power, lays down what is just, and what is done by the ruler is ipso facto just (dikaios) and lawful (themistos, translated by Warren as ‘right’). From this anecdote, Warren generalizes about Anaxarchus’ ethics: Alexander “may be said to be Anaxarchus’ indifferent man writ large” (82). No things are valuable by nature, and the wise person realizes this and is able to become “the arbiter for himself of various values” (82) with no external constraints on the decisions he makes that impose value on the world.

This anecdote is philosophically suggestive, but I have reservations about Warren’s line of argument. First, the anecdote indicates that Anaxarchus is a conventionalist about justice and lawfulness, but this need not generalize to value across the board. Furthermore, Alexander is in a unique position because of his power. It’s dubious to infer from Alexander’s situation that all people have the power to create values through fiat, unconstrained by external considerations and empty opinion. In Alexander’s case, there is an obvious way in which the opinions of others about what to do are empty, as far as he’s concerned, that doesn’t apply to the man on the street. Second, even if Anaxarchus does have the anti-realist moral position Warren ascribes to him, this doesn’t show that his anti-realism is restricted to morals in particular. He may have a much wider eliminativist position that applies also to moral properties.

Warren turns in his next chapter to Pyrrho and Timon. Warren says Pyrrho’s position is similar to Anaxarchus’. The key text for understanding Pyrrho’s thought has long been recognized to be a report by Aristocles, preserved in Eusebius, which declares that our sensations and judgments tell us neither truths nor falsehoods, because things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable, and undecidable. (Thus, the epistemological point depends on a sweeping metaphysical claim.) Warren defends the received text from a proposed emendation by Zeller, which would reverse the direction of inference: we should conclude that things are indifferent, etc. because our sensations and judgments tell us neither truths nor falsehoods. After defending the received text, however, Warren goes on to argue that for Pyrrho things are not ‘indistinct’ “in the sense of being metaphysically indistinct, but in the moral sense of having no intrinsic value” (92). (Although, if this is right, then it seems that Pyrrho should say that our judgments about things having value should be false, instead of neither true nor false.)

To support this, Warren notes that Pyrrho insists on the unreality of moral values particularly strongly and often (for instance at DL 9.61) and that for Pyrrho one gains ataraxia by believing that things are indifferent as far as their value is concerned. Warren acknowledges that many later reports seem to extend Pyrrho’s claims about indifference beyond the moral realm to the world in general and what can be known via the senses. However, he claims that, as in the case of Anaxarchus, these claims are later accretions. In particular, Warren tries to draw a sharp distinction between Pyrrho, whose skepticism extends only to morals, and Timon, who has a global skepticism and reworks Pyrrho in light of this. According to Warren, Timon is not merely a reporter, but an important independent thinker. This is an intriguing thesis, and Warren gives some other support for it. (Hankinson tentatively puts forward a similar proposal about the limits of Pyrrho’s skepticism and the relative independence of Timon’s thought (65-73).)

The case for Pyrrho’s skepticism (or really, negative dogmatism) extending only to value is much stronger than the case for Anaxarchus having such a position, but I’m not convinced. The later reports that portray Pyrrho as a global skeptic may well be later accretions, but it’s hard to see how to determine this one way or the other, while still having confidence that the reports that point toward a restricted moral skepticism are reliable. Also, having indifference about values in particular is consistent with having indifference about things in general, as is thinking that indifference about values is particularly important for the attainment of ataraxia. After all, this seems to be Sextus’ position.

Warren then goes on to consider the response of the later Epicurean Polystratus to skeptical arguments that claim that values cannot exist in truth because what is fine and foul varies from place to place. Polystratus’ reply, basically, is that relational and dispositional properties can be real, as cases of certain foods being nutritious for some creatures but harmful for others make clear. This chapter also contains a quite interesting discussion of the ambiguity of pig imagery in Epicurean and skeptical thought: pigs were widely considered both amoral, unintellectual gluttons and symbols of ataraxia. In addition, Warren considers the place of distinctively human rational capacities in Epicurean ethics, as opposed to Pyrrho’s attempt to strip off the human.

Following this is a short chapter called “Hecataeus of Abdera’s Instructive Ethnography.” The title is misleading, since Warren says that we can’t really tell anything about Hecataean philosophy based on the second-hand and probably paraphrased material we have. Despite this, Warren believes Hecataeus has significance: Hecataeus shows that there is a link between the ‘Abderites’ and the ‘Pyrrhonians,’ since he is counted as a member of both groups (159). This seems fairly thin, though, and I don’t see how the inclusion of Hecataeus contributes to the overall project of the book.

The final predecessor Warren considers is Epicurus’ teacher Nausiphanes. After some remarks on the relationship of Nausiphanes to Pyrrho and Nausiphanes’ candidate for the telos, akataplêxia (unshakeability), Warren tries to reconstruct Nausiphanes’ ethical theory by looking at the fragmentary remains of the Epicurean Philodemus’ attack on Nausiphanes’ rhetorical theory. This material is philosophically rich, but I don’t think we can draw from it the conclusions about Nausiphanes’ and Epicurus’ ethical theories that Warren thinks we can. The passages are quite gappy, but Warren thinks (I believe correctly) that Nausiphanes’ main theses about rhetoric are:

  • Oratory is a technê.
  • Somebody who knows natural philosophy (phusiologia) will know what nature wants.
  • Knowledge of natural philosophy is sufficient training for knowing the technê of oratory, and thus for being able to improve the lives of one’s fellow citizens by offering reasoned advice on what nature wants and how to achieve it.

Whereas Philodemus and Epicurus hold the following:

  • Oratory is not a technê, but a knack which one picks up through experience (empeiria).
  • In any case, knowing phusiologia is not sufficient for persuasion of an audience, since phusiologia need not command universal assent (as SV 29 makes clear). Instead, successful oratory would also require knowledge of the audience’s desires and beliefs, and how to appeal to them.

Warren says that the source of the dispute between Nausiphanes and Epicurus on rhetoric is that Nausiphanes is a reductivist atomist who insists on a ‘close link’ (an identification?) of desirable psychological states such as euthumia, akataplêxia, or ataraxia with a certain physical state of the soul and who thinks that knowledge of phusiologia is sufficient for knowledge of the human good, whereas Epicurus is a non-reductive atomist who rejects these claims. I think that this is a stretch. First, Warren does not specify in what sense Nausiphanes is a ‘reductivist’ and Epicurus is not, so it’s difficult to evaluate his claim. In discussing this issue Warren slides from correctly noting that Epicurus objects generally to Democritus’ eliminativism to then saying that Epicurus therefore objects in particular to Nausiphanes’ “attempt to reduce ethics to physics” (177). But this is perplexing, since eliminativist materialism is quite different from reductionist materialism, and somebody could quite happily hold that tranquility is identical to a certain physical arrangement of soul atoms while objecting to the damaging ethical implications of abolishing psychological states from one’s ontology. In fact, I think that that’s Epicurus’ own position. (See O’Keefe (2002) for further discussion of the distinction between Democritus’ eliminativism vs. Epicurus’ reductionism.) In any case, no deep-seated metaphysical anti-reductionism about the nature of the mind is implied by anything in Philodemus’ discussion of rhetoric and his attack on Nausiphanes. Almost any reductionist could accept all of the theses Philodemus advances. David Armstrong, for instance, has an identity theory of mind, but he could still think that people need practical experience in order to learn how to speak well, and that knowledge of sub-atomic physics on its own will not enable one to speak persuasively to people on how to live their lives.

At the end of his book, Warren briefly turns, in a section which spans 8 pages, to consider what light is shed on Epicurus’ ethics from the preceding discussion. He notes that the Epicurean Colotes attacks Democritus because his eliminativism regarding macroscopic qualities like colors leads to skepticism, and hence makes life impossible. And Epicurus himself, in the anti-fatalist digression in On Nature book 25, attacks Democritus because of the effect Democritus’ eliminative materialism would have on our conception of ourselves as causally efficacious agents, and hence on our practices of praise, blame, and argumentation itself. All of this is true, but it’s all been noted before. None of it helps substantiate Warren’s claim that Epicurus’ ethics was shaped in reaction to problematic strains within Democritean ethical theories. Nowhere does Warren clearly explain how the connection is supposed to work.

The sketchiness of this final section of Warren’s book is a shame, because the topic is promising: what is the ontological status of ethical properties for Epicurus, how do ethical properties fit into Epicurus’ metaphysics more generally, and how does this conception of ethical properties respond to worries about skeptical ou mallon arguments in general and Democritus’ eliminative materialism in particular? Furthermore, what is it that that gives ethical properties their value in a world with no deities and no teleology? Warren’s discussion raises these sorts of metaethical issues but does not clearly deal with them.

Despite these shortcomings, I appreciate that Warren has drawn attention to the ethics of Epicurus’ Democritean predecessors, and I hope that this book will serve as a basis for further work in the area.


Barnes, Jonathan. 1982. The Presocratic Philosophers. London: Routledge, London and New York.

Hankinson, R. J. 1995. The Sceptics. Routledge, London and New York.

O’Keefe, Tim. 2002. “The Reductionist and Compatibilist Argument of Epicurus’ On Nature Book 25,” Phronesis, vol. 47 no. 2 153-186.