Epicurus in the Enlightenment

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Neven Leddy and Avi S. Lifschitz (eds.), Epicurus in the Enlightenment, Voltaire Foundation, 2009, 258pp., $105, ISBN 9780729409872.

Reviewed by Michael W. Hickson, University of Winnipeg



This collection of essays stems from a conference held at Oxford in summer 2006, the motivation for which was that “Enlightenment Epicureanism [was] due for a comprehensive reappraisal in the light of historical, philosophical and literary studies conducted since the 1960s” (2). The standard view, named “militant Epicureanism” by the editors, is equated with Peter Gay’s “black-and-white” portrayal of Lucretius in The Enlightenment: an interpretation (1, 2). Militant Epicureanism is an “anti-religious weapon,” a “combative stance,” an “extremely belligerent philosophy” with a “cohesive set of ideas with a single overarching goal” (2). The excellent essays assembled in this volume aim to provide a more nuanced view of Epicureanism in the eighteenth century and to show that it was not a unified doctrine deployed as part of a single strategy, but had as many distinct goals as it had authors putting it to use.

The appearance of this volume so shortly after that of Catherine Wilson’s Epicureanism at the Origins of Modernity should signal to the reader that the essays in this collection could not have taken Wilson’s book into account: these two works were written or assembled roughly simultaneously and the results are almost entirely independent (Wilson’s book was partly composed of earlier published essays, one of which gets cited in a footnote in this collection). However, the works arrive at some similar conclusions: that Epicureanism had to be distanced from its anti-theistic origins before it could comfortably find its place in modernity, and that more than just atomism and contractualism were its legacies, to take two examples. But the differences between the two works are stark. Wilson’s focus, like that of many who have worked on modern Epicureanism, was on the seventeenth century, and the bulk of her book was devoted to “canonical” philosophers. Leddy and Lifschitz, on the other hand, have made the eighteenth century the concern of this collection, and have included essays on both major and minor figures, from many more countries than the usual France and England.

Methodology is what most distinguishes the essays in this collection from other similar works, including Wilson’s. Rather than tracing the “influence” and “reception” of Epicureanism, these essays focus on the “selective appropriation” of Epicurean texts in the eighteenth century. So rather than asking questions like, ‘who in the eighteenth century read this or that edition or translation of De rerum natura,’ or ‘whose views were, on the whole, most Epicurean in aim or spirit,’ the essays in this volume seek to uncover the manifold ways in which individual passages, arguments and themes of Epicureanism were picked up and used within religious, ethical, political, scientific, and linguistic works of Enlightenment authors, whether or not those authors were interested in or sympathetic to Epicureanism as a whole. While this methodology gives rise to a number of fascinating individual papers, however, it prevents the work as a whole from having any discernible unity.

In the editors’ introduction there is much made about moving beyond Gay’s portrayal of a modern Epicureanism everywhere subversive of religion, so it is rather surprising that the first essay in the collection largely amounts to a straightforward reaffirmation, rather than a critical reassessment, of the militant view. In one of the volume’s most philosophically engaging chapters, “Bayle’s defence of Epicurus,” Elodie Argaud suggests that Bayle’s intention in the article “Epicurus,” remarks S and T, of the Dictionnaire was to defend Epicurus’ denial of divine providence by “hijacking” an argument for providence found in Malebranche’s Méditations chrétiennes (20). Argaud’s analysis and interpretation of Bayle’s article is masterful as it carefully follows Bayle’s advice to readers, that they should carefully check the texts cited by an author — advice which, in this case, yields the discovery of multiple layers of Bayle’s text. Argaud’s interpretation of “Epicurus” is an original reading of an important article of the Dictionnaire; however, her ultimate conclusions do not constitute original interpretations on the whole of either modern Epicureanism or of Bayle, which on Argaud’s reading (and many others’) were both subversive of religion.

I think the proper account of Bayle’s “Epicurus” is even more complicated than Argaud’s already complex reading suggests, as careful attention to remark L of that article makes clear. There Bayle cites his friend, Jacques du Rondel, who had argued in his De Vita et Moribus Epicuri that, in fact, Epicurus never denied divine providence. Bayle concludes that remark by praising the way in which Du Rondel had learnedly captured Epicurus’ “paradoxical orthodoxy concerning providence.” It would appear from this remark that Bayle agreed with Du Rondel’s reading of Epicurus, in which case it is not obvious what Bayle was defending when he “defended Epicurus” — but the denial of providence seems out of the question. Following up that reference might lead to the less belligerent and subversive picture of modern Epicureanism which this volume’s editors promised.

Another surprising essay in light of the editors’ introduction is the second, “The Epicurean motif in Dutch notions of sociability in the seventeenth century,” by Hans W. Blom. Leddy and Lifschitz show in their introduction that Epicureanism has not been sufficiently recognized as a powerful third classical influence in addition to Augustinianism and Stoicism in the development of Enlightenment thought: “Epicureanism has been subsumed under either the Augustinian or the Stoic traditions” (6). One contribution of this volume, we are told, is that its authors will question “the marginalisation of Epicureanism in relation to both Stoicism and Augustinianism”; yet in the second essay, “Blom describes how Epicureanism was subsumed into a more politically relevant Stoic anti-Augustinianism in the seventeenth-century Netherlands” (9). Blom’s essay in itself is excellent, as it provides an interesting and original interpretation of Bernard Mandeville’s thought by placing it against the background and interplay of the above-mentioned three classical influences. However, like Argaud’s essay, it seems to contradict one of the stated aims of this volume by further marginalising Epicureanism.

The distinctiveness of the Epicurean motif vis-à-vis those of Stoicism and Augustinianism is developed explicitly, however, by Pierre Force in his essay, “Helvétius as an Epicurean political theorist.” After suggesting that La Rochefoucauld, Bayle and Mandeville form part of an “Epicurean/Augustinian tradition” (106), Force goes on to argue that Helvétius represents a break in this tradition and a movement toward Epicureanism: "One could think of this book [De l’esprit] as the moment in which the Epicurean/Augustinian tradition takes a resolutely Epicurean turn" (110).

One of the virtues of this collection is its interdisciplinary and pan-European perspectives. In addition to Blom’s article, which focuses on the Netherlands, there are also articles on the German and Russian Enlightenments. A fascinating introduction to a largely ignored figure is found in Andrew Kahn’s “Epicureanism in the Russian Enlightenment,” which treats the life and works of "a rare Russian example of the true philosophe" (121), the mathematician and philosopher, Dmitrii Anichkov. The bulk of Kahn’s essay looks at Anichkov’s 1783 Discourse on the different methods of explicating the dense connection between the soul and the body, a work which embraces Epicurean physics as it was transmitted by Lucretius, argues against dualism, introduces Malebranche into Russia, criticizes Leibniz, and somewhat paradoxically (in light of Anichkov’s refutation of dualism) concludes that body and soul are separate substances (127). Kahn argues that “Anichkov has a claim to being the first genuine Russian Enlightenment thinker” (134), placing the beginning of the Russian Enlightenment several decades later than Jonathan Israel had done in his Radical Enlightenment.

In Thomas Ahnert’s piece, “Epicureanism and the transformation of natural law in the early German Enlightenment,” the motivation for acting in accordance with the natural law, especially the degree to which self-interest plays a role, is investigated in the works of Pufendorf, Thomasius and Schmauss. The author himself admits that Epicureanism is only loosely invoked in this paper as a reproach that each of these authors commonly sought to avoid (53, 57, 58). In fact, the argument of the paper concerning the evolution of natural law theory in the period would read just as cogently without any mention of Epicureanism at all. Ahnert’s article assumes implicit responses to questions like the extent to which ‘Epicureanism’ was a smear word with a single meaning in the period, or the extent to which authors had any real reason to fear the label ‘Epicurean’ (not an obvious question given the number of apologies for Epicurus and his morals that appeared in the seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries). These are questions worth studying, for as we read in Charles T. Wolfe’s paper, “A happiness fit for organic bodies: La Mettrie’s medical Epicureanism,” the term ‘Epicureanism’ cannot be assumed to have had a single meaning in the period, and not all Epicureans were thought equally worthy of censure. Just as Diderot distinguished in the Encyclopédie between “Spinosistes anciens” and “Spinosistes moderns,” so too, Wolfe argues, there are distinctions in kinds of Epicureanism to be noted in the period (75).

The findings of Wolfe’s paper are therefore relevant to the thesis of Ahnert’s paper (even if one is focused on France and the other on Germany), which leads me to a general criticism of this collection: the contributors never reference or engage each other. Between the conference in 2006 and the publication of this collection in 2009 there was surely time for authors to revise their papers with the work of the others in mind. If they had done so it would have added unity to the book which, in its present form, it lacks. It does not justify the lack of unity to say, as the editors of this volume do in their introduction, that

this collection of essays seeks to demonstrate that Epicureanism in the Enlightenment was anything but a unified doctrine. As argued in this volume, it was built out of a variety of components, often applied independently of one another, in different contexts and with multiple strategies (2).

Such claims cannot legitimately be made unless the contributing authors engage each other’s work and prove that what one discovers about Epicureanism cannot be reduced to or easily reconciled with what another author discovered. Given the absence of such engagement, all that the reader of this collection can be sure of is that the views of this work’s contributors form “anything but a unified doctrine”; as for Epicureanism in the Enlightenment itself, its unity as a doctrine is still an open question.

However, one of the greatest strengths of Epicurus in the Enlightenment in fact arises from the above weakness. While this work in no way fills the gap in the literature surrounding the reception of Epicureanism in the eighteenth century, it does succeed through its diverse essays in widening that gap; that is, the authors demonstrate what a fertile area of research this topic will be in the future. This is partly accomplished by its pan-European focus, but more importantly by the contributors’ exploration of themes going beyond atomism, hedonism and contractualism — the usual Epicurean topics. Natania Meeker’s paper, “Sexing Epicurean materialism in Diderot,” is boldest in this regard, investigating the ways in which Epicureanism and femininity were related in Diderot’s thought. Meeker begins by an analysis of Diderot’s mysterious claim in the Encyclopédie entry on “épicuréisme” that "on se fait stoicien, mais on naît épicurien" (92). Meeker claims that for Diderot “We are all Epicureans … in the sense that we are all embodied human beings; to be Epicurean is simply to be born in the world” (94). She continues by paralleling this claim by an analysis of Diderot’s Sur les femmes, which Meeker suggests shows “that femininity as a form of physiological experience is one that we all must pass through — and to which we constantly return” (101). An upshot of Meeker’s fascinating piece is a novel interpretation of Seneca’s claim in De vita beata that “Epicurus was a hero disguised as a woman” (85).

In Avi Lifschitz’s “The Enlightenment revival of the Epicurean history of language and civilisation,” we are given another paper on a neglected topic concerning the modern reception of Epicurus. Lifschitz demonstrates that Enlightenment thinkers who were interested in establishing the human, non-divine origin of civilization or morals could engage these controversial topics less dangerously by focusing instead on the parallel problem of the origin of language. Lifschitz surveys a wide range of authors — Hobbes, Pufendorf, Simon, Locke, Leibniz, Mandeville, Vico, Warburton, Rousseau, Condillac, among others — to show that the Lucretian compromise between a purely conventional origin of language and a primordial association between words and things was revived in the period (212). Such a compromise, however, met with the challenge of aligning this naturalistic theory of language with the Biblical revelation that Adam was the first to name things. This excellent article follows the gradual rise and then fall of the Epicurean picture vis-à-vis the Genesis account.

In “Man, morals and matter: Epicurus and materialist thought in England from John Toland to Joseph Priestley,” Matthew Niblett shows that Epicurean physics was decreasingly associated with anti-clerical intent over the course of the eighteenth century in England. Materialists like Toland, Collins and Mandeville, writing toward the beginning of the century, were seen as undermining the foundations of religion with their views, whereas by the last quarter of the century Priestley was offering a “theistic materialism” and arguing against the atheist materialism of d’Holbach (157).

The chapter that will likely interest philosophers the most is James Harris’ “The Epicurean in Hume.” Harris’ goal is to contest James Moore’s thesis that Hume drew upon Epicureanism in a number of different ways in developing his philosophy, and that Hume is to Hutcheson as the Epicurean is to the Stoic (163). Harris begins by surveying the early modern literature on Epicureanism to determine how that school was perceived in Hume’s time, after which he delineates a number of ways in which Hume’s philosophy parts radically from what Hume would have seen as the essentials of Epicurus’ philosophy. The major non-Epicurean elements of Hume’s philosophy are identified by Harris as: Hume’s rejection of sense knowledge as a criterion of truth (168); his scepticism about the nature of body and mind (168); his agnosticism about the origin of the order of the universe (168); his more refined position (than that of Epicurus) on the role of pleasure and pain in moral motivation (169); and his disassociation of moral theory from moral practice (177). Harris devotes a section to showing that the Epicurean interpretations of Hume given by his contemporary critics, Balfour and Reid, are unconvincing.

Harris begins his article with this observation about the Enlightenment: “Hellenistic philosophy is particularly important to the period’s philosophical self-understanding. Philosophers call themselves and their opponents ‘Stoic’, ‘Sceptic’, and ‘Epicurean’ much more often than ‘Platonist’ or ‘Aristotelian’” (161). Thanks to Leddy and Lifschitz’s volume, therefore, we are in a better position to understand parts of eighteenth-century philosophy in the way in which they were understood in that very period. The individual papers in this volume make significant contributions to the discussion of the authors they treat; but as with most collections, this one leaves it up to the readers to draw their own conclusions about how these disparate snapshots fit into a bigger picture.