Epiphenomenal Mind: An Integrated Outlook on Sensations, Beliefs, and Pleasure

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William S. Robinson, Epiphenomenal Mind: An Integrated Outlook on Sensations, Beliefs, and Pleasure, Routledge, 2019, 202pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138351370.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


Any philosopher interested in the philosophy of mind should read William S. Robinson's book. It is a clear, thoughtful, well-argued, and sophisticated discussion of how to understand our talk about such mental states as sensation, belief, and pleasure. Robinson takes the arguments where they lead him, and they lead him to provide a quite different analysis of sensation from the one he offers of belief and other intentional states.

In Chapters 1 through 4, the emphasis is on sensations. Here Robinson rejects various attempts to identify sensations with physical states or functional states realized only by physical phenomena. The dualism he defends is a form of epiphenomenalism. While Robinson thinks we must embrace the fact that we cannot successfully reduce sensations to physical phenomena, he also insists that we do not need to attribute any causal power to sensations.

In Chapters 5 through 9, Robinson turns his attention to belief and other intentional states. Here he argues that it is simply a mistake to view belief, understanding, and other sorts of intentional states as occurrent states that are anything like sensations. Once we recognize the mistake, we will be much more amenable to various forms of reduction. I'll discuss those reductions in more detail below.

Epiphenomenal Sensations

Robinson argues that sensations have a phenomenological character that precludes any plausible identification of them with neural or functional states. In the language of many who embrace qualia, Robinson argues that there is a "what it is like" to have the visual sensation of phenomenological red, the auditory sensation of a high pitch note, the olfactory sensation of a sweet-smelling rose, the tactile sensation of roughness, the gustatory sensation of sourness, the sensation of pain, and some sensations of pleasure. These qualia are real and they resist any plausible reduction to physical phenomena, including the complex neural states that causally produce them. According to Robinson, they are epiphenomenal. We need to include them in our ontology, but we do not need to attribute causal powers to them. Everything that happens has a physical explanation.

In presenting his position, Robinson often refers his readers to arguments he has made elsewhere. I'll focus in these brief remarks only on two questions he does consider here. The first concerns the ontological status of sensations; the second, his commitment to epiphenomenalism. Early in the book (p. 5), Robinson refers to a philosopher who once asked him what the bearers of qualia are. So on one reading of Robinson, the qualia he is presented with are properties, and it is natural to wonder what kind of thing has the properties of phenomenal redness, phenomenal circularity, phenomenal roughness, and so on. That he does recognize that properties will figure into his account of what sensations are seems obvious. He does, for example, suggest that phenomenal (my characterization) blueness is a monadic, not a relational property (p. 19). He also talks about necessary truths about the exemplification of phenomenal properties, truths that are made true by relationships between the properties exemplified in sensing (e.g., whatever is phenomenally red is not phenomenally blue -- my example). But again, what is it that has these phenomenal properties?

Robinson emphatically rejects the suggestion that it might be neural events that exemplify phenomenal properties. One of his main arguments against this view is that one would never expect to become aware of such properties no matter how good one gets at observing the intricacies of neural events. The argument reminds one of a complaint against materialism suggested by Leibniz. Imagine a miniaturized perceiver exploring the physical brain looking in vain for phenomenal color, sour taste sensations, and the like. They would obviously never be found. In response, however, one might suggest that the interesting version of the view that phenomenal properties might be exemplified by entities or events in the brain combines that view with an older empiricism that insists that all knowledge of, and justified belief in, contingent propositions describing the physical world is inferential. The physical world, on such a view, is knowable only through inference from how that world appears, where these appearances are precisely the phenomenal data recognized by Robinson. An even more extreme version of this form of empiricism combines that epistemological view with a distinction between direct and indirect thought. Some things we are able to think of only indirectly, as whatever it is that bears some sort of relation to other things that we think of directly. So there is a sense in which I can think of, and even speculate about, Descartes's favorite color, but my thought of that color is just the thought of whatever color it is that Descartes liked more than any other. So also some have held that our thought about the physical is only thought about whatever it is that stands in certain causal connections to the familiar interconnected sensations exemplifying their phenomenal character. On either the view that knowledge of the physical is always indirect or the view that thought about the physical is always indirect, it would remain a completely open question as to what the physical is like intrinsically. It would therefore be an open question as to whether neural events might exemplify qualia.

As I indicated above, Robinson rejects this view, and embraces instead the idea that sensations are best understood as events, events that cannot be reduced to or identified with physical events. The book contains little general discussion of the thorny issue of how to understand the category of event, and the above worry about what exemplifies phenomenal properties might arise again if events were to be understood as constituted by property exemplifications. But let us turn to the second claim of Robinson's that I want to discuss -- the claim that phenomenal states are causally impotent.

The idea is familiar enough. We don't need to posit a causal connection between the mental and the physical to explain any of the phenomena that need explaining. The physical universe is "causally closed" and we have perfectly good physical explanations for mental phenomena we are forced to admit into our ontology. That claim is, however, obviously compatible with the idea that there is causal over-determination of physical and mental phenomena. While my neural events may causally explain my grimace, so also, my severe pain might seem an equally plausible candidate for the cause of my grimace. Indeed, the pain is what ordinary people would most naturally identify as the relevant cause. If I have a complaint about Robinson's discussion of epiphenomenalism, it is that it takes place without an account of what makes one event/property exemplification/state of affairs the cause of another. To be fair, such a complaint must be strongly tempered. Philosophers have written entire books trying to understand causation, usually without much success. But if one employs ordinary criteria for when something x can cause something else y, the sensation of pain does fairly well as a candidate for the cause of the grimace. It might seem plausible, for example, to suggest that the grimace wouldn't have occurred but for the pain. The reply that the grimace would have occurred whether or not the pain occurred as long as the relevant neural activity occurred doesn't seem to settle anything. After all, the pain and the neural activity might be lawfully correlated in such a way that neither would occur without the other. If that were so, then but for the pain, neither the neural activity nor the grimace would have occurred. Of course, the "but for" test of causal connection is problematic in all sorts of ways (including that it doesn't handle easily preemption and over-determination). But that might just underscore the need to place an argument for epiphenomenalism within a more general sketch of a view about what causation is.

I'll just briefly mention one other concern that relates to Robinson's own argument for the existence of qualia. Although this isn't quite the language that Robinson himself uses, he might be sympathetic to the idea that one's justification for supposing that there are phenomenal states is crucially related to the fact that one is acquainted with them. One can't wish them out of existence because they are ontologically inconvenient. On one view of doxastic justification, a belief that one has a visual sensation of phenomenal redness is doxastically justified only if it is caused by something that justifies the belief. I think Robinson agrees that it is not one's awareness of neural activity that justifies one's belief that one has a certain sort of visual experience. It is, rather, one's awareness of the phenomenal state itself. But, arguably, the awareness of the phenomenal state couldn't occur without the phenomenal state. So isn't the phenomenal state, after all, playing a critical causal role in the doxastic justification of a belief that the state exists?


As I indicated earlier, Robinson is deeply suspicious of the claim that beliefs (and other full-blown intentional states) are anything like sensations. They are not, according to Robinson, events. Beliefs are, Robinson argues, dispositions. Of course, many philosophers recognize the existence of dispositional beliefs, but Robinson's view is that there is no such thing as occurrent belief if that is supposed to be something event-like. The rough idea underlying Robinson's view is that S believes that P when S is disposed to behave the way someone who says that "P" would behave. Robinson calls this the quasi-quotational view (p. 95). He realizes that the rough idea is, as it stands, far too rough. He acknowledges the force of the objection that Grice, Chisholm, and others have raised to behavioristic analysis of belief. How a person acts is almost always a function of not just what that person believes, but also of what that person wants. We would also surely want to distinguish the person who says "P" and understands what he or she is saying from the person who utters the sentence without understanding it. Nothing will follow about what a person will do from what sounds that person makes.

While Robinson is well aware of the difficulties his approach faces, it is not as clear to me what his solutions to the problems are. He suggests (p. 97) that we can take some philosophical comfort from the fact that on many matters there is a fair bit of overlap and stability in terms of what people want. But if one is trying to offer a traditional philosophical analysis of what belief is, I'm not sure how this helps. As long as it is a contingent question as to what people want, and a contingent fact that these wants influence their actions, how can one get a philosophical theory of belief based on the dispositions of people to behave in various ways?

On one natural reading of Robinson (confirmed by subsequent conversations I have had with him), his response to this sort of worry will involve a rejection of many of the metaphilosophical presuppositions upon which the concerns are based. He clearly doesn't intend to be offering anything like necessary and sufficient conditions for what it is to believe a given proposition. And while he sometimes suggests that his target is better understood as giving an account of what it is to ascribe belief to someone, here also he is not going to be seduced in to giving an account that can be evaluated using the thought experiments that have been the stock and trade of philosophers objecting to conceptual analyses. If anything, his approach might be best described as influenced by the later Wittgenstein who, on one reading, sought to explain the meaning of a term in terms of so-called "non-defining criteria." Crudely, on such a view, the semantic rules we follow when using a term involve understanding the conditions that count for or against the application of that word. No matter how many criteria are satisfied one can still imagine data coming in that would count against the application of the term.

While the idea that one can understand meaning in terms of confirmation conditions is intriguing, I worry that it presupposes precisely what the proponent of such a view denies -- that we have an understanding of terms like "believes" that is independent of the various ways we confirm that someone has a belief. After all, we understand why non-defining criteria for belief can be satisfied without the belief existing only because we can understand what it is to believe something even absent the relevant dispositions that we often associate with belief.

These metaphilosophical issues are not the focus of Robinson's book, and this is not the place to discuss them in any detail. Suffice it to say that Robinson's success or failure in explaining belief and other intentional states may stand of fall with critical metaphilosophical views that lurk in the background. That might be true of potential circularity that might seem to face Robinson's view. We are trying to understand both belief and what it is to ascribe belief to someone. Robinson insists that to believe is to exemplify certain dispositions. The dispositions seem to include having certain expectations. And these expectations are themselves understood in terms of dispositions to be surprised when certain things happen (or fail to happen). Surprise seems to be an intentional state. It probably involves (Robinson would agree, I think) some sort of qualitative feel, but it also involves a cognitive state -- a state that involves belief. To be surprised at X one must at the very least believe that X has occurred. But now we have come full circle. We are trying to say something illuminating about belief and ascriptions of belief. We start talking about expectations. That leads us to dispositions to be surprised. Those dispositions lead us right back to belief. Are we really making any progress? I suppose that one might at this point gesture in the direction of some form of holism -- the idea that one can only confirm and (more radically) understand language in terms of systems of sentences and their inferential and probabilistic connections. For reasons I can't go into here, however, I do view holism as a heavy price to pay for defending a philosophical view.


As I suggested earlier, the "quasi-quotational" approach to understanding belief and belief ascriptions would seem to require an obvious modification. It isn't even plausible to associate someone's believing that P with their being disposed to behave as if they had said "P" unless one adds that the person in question understands "P." Indeed, one might well hold that one is saying "P" (as opposed to merely uttering certain sounds) only if the relevant understanding is involved. The question of how to understand understanding is perhaps the most fundamental question in both the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of language. The classic debate between Chisholm and Sellars was a debate about which, if either, is more fundamental. Chisholm was convinced that only a capacity to think can breathe life into language. Sellars rejected this idea. Robinson clearly sides more with Sellars. In the book, Robinson doesn't give us much of a feel for what it is for one to understand a given piece of language. It doesn't seem likely that we can appeal to dispositions to behave in ways someone would if they say various things which they understand. This circularity isn't even subtle. It might be more plausible again to appeal to some sort of holism. One understands "P" when one has dispositions to make certain inferences, to say such and such were one to say such and such else. I have always been suspicious of such accounts on the grounds that the appropriateness of inferences (even from the first-person perspective) seems essentially connected to the individual content of the various sentences that stand in logical and probabilistic connections.


It is in the nature of reviews that they focus on areas of disagreement. I close by stressing reservations I express concerning his account of intentional states have force, so also do the reservations Robinson expresses concerning certain traditional views. Intentional states such as belief are phenomenologically elusive. It is difficult to "find" them through introspection (the way one obviously can find pain and various sensations). It is important to look for alternatives, and Robinson's book takes us on an exciting exploration of philosophical possibilities.