Episteme, etc.: Essays in Honour of Jonathan Barnes

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Ben Morison and Katerina Ierodiakonou (eds.), Episteme, etc.: Essays in Honour of Jonathan Barnes, Oxford University Press, 2012, 384pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696482.

Reviewed by Gerhard Seel, University of Bern


This volume contains "Essays in Honour of Jonathan Barnes", but it is not -- as traditional 'Festschrifts' often are -- a random collection of papers scholars may have forgotten in the depths of their drawers. It rather contains -- under the headings 'Knowledge', 'Logic and Metaphysics' and 'Ethics and Politics' -- new and important contributions to a set of ongoing debates, mostly but not exclusively concerning ancient epistemology. The title Episteme, etc. is therefore well-coined, echoing Barnes' own Truth, etc. I have learned from all contributions, and am in agreement with most of them, although for some I have some criticism and comments to offer. Understandably the latter will get more attention.


Myles Burnyeat's paper Episteme (3-29) may have inspired the title of the volume. His question is whether there is a way in which the Greek verbs epistasthai, eidenai and gignoskein and the substantives episteme, eidesis and gnosis correspond to the twentieth century distinction between 'knowing that', 'knowing how' and 'knowing by acquaintance'. As one would expect, the answer is negative. However, there is more in Burnyeat's paper. Following Lyons' ground-breaking Structural Semantics of 1963, he establishes the semantics of these expressions, including the difference between Plato's and Aristotle's uses of them.

R.J. Hankinson (30-59) tries to do the same job concerning the use of the terms nous and noein. Here again there is an opposition between Plato, the 'rationalist' and Aristotle, the 'empiricist'. Giving sometimes new interpretations of the relevant passages, Hankinson argues that Aristotle developed a "causal account" (57) of the acquisition of knowledge of universals and thus has to be considered as an 'empiricist'.

Katharina Ierodiakonou (60-73) gives an overview of the development of the notion of enargeia (obviousness) in Hellenistic philosophy as a key to our understanding of the debate about the foundation of knowledge.

Julia Annas (74-89) shows that the Pyrrhonist can lead an ordinary religious life without abandoning his skepticism about the existence of gods.

In her paper "Concepts and inquiry: Sextus and the Epicureans" (90-114) Gail Fine asks whether the Epicurean challenge to the possibility of skeptical inquiry can be met by the Skeptics. This challenge is reported by Sextus himself (in M 8,337-341). The Epicurean school is said to have confronted the skeptics with the following dilemma:

Either you understand (noeite) what proof is or you do not. If you understand it, and (kai) have a concept (ennoia) of it, there is such a thing as proof. But if you do not understand it, how can you inquire into what you have not the slightest understanding of (nooumenon)?

Fine gives a reconstruction of the argument in twelve points and argues that, of these, points (4) and (5) are both highly questionable and crucial for the validity of the argument. They are:

(4) If there is a concept of x, there is such a thing as x.

(5) One can inquire whether there is such a thing as x only if one has a concept of x.

Consequently, Fine asks whether the Epicureans do in fact hold (4) and (5) and whether the Skeptics have to accept both. Her answer to the first question is that (4) is a position of the Epicurean school if and only if the term 'concept' stands for an Epicurean prolepsis (preconception) and, by contrast, (5) is acceptable for the Epicureans if and only if 'concept' does not mean prolepsis. But the term 'concept' needs to be used unequivocally for a valid argument to ensue. Therefore, Fine concludes, the argument is either valid and unsound -- because at least one premise is false -- or invalid because of the equivocal use of the term 'concept'.

The second question occupies the last part of her paper. She shows that Sextus' reply to the challenge follows exactly the line given above. Against Brunschwig, she argues further that the Skeptics do not need to accept either (4) or (5). In fact they reject both. Fine concludes with an anti-skeptical reflection, which recalls Wittgenstein's 'On Certainty': One needs at least some roughly accurate beliefs in order to inquire.

The volume contains a paper (115-137) of the late Michael Frede which he submitted before his tragic death. Frede shows that three Rationalist doctors, Diocles of Carystus, Herophilus and Galen disagreed with Aristotle on the role observation and experience have to play in medical knowledge and that, concerning this point, they are rationalists to different degrees. One can only admire how Frede achieves this by carefully reading and analyzing just one sentence of each author.

Logic and Metaphysics

The second section starts with a paper (141-150) by Gisela Striker. She analyzes the ontology that we find in Aristotle's Categories, chapter 2.

In his penetrating "Remarks on substance and essence in Aristotle's Metaphysics Z.6" (151-171) David Charles shows that Aristotle's claim in the opening lines of Met. Z, 6 that "each thing is not other than its essence" cannot be understood in terms of numerical identity. He represents Aristotle's claim in the following formula:

[Α]* x is the essence of y only if y is essentially the same as x

and then proposes two possible interpretations:

[Β]* x is the essence of y only if x=y

[C]* x is the essence of y only if y is defined in terms of x

Charles argues that attributing [B]* to Aristotle would accuse him of a category mistake. According to Aristotle the essence is prior to the thing it is the essence of. But this priority disappears with [B]*. Charles then argues that there is no evidence in Z.6 in favor of [B]*. He shows that those who defend [B]* have only one way to avoid the absurdity noted above: attributing to Aristotle the concept of individual essences. But Charles shows that even in this case it would be preferable to avoid the identity of a thing and its individual essence.

Ben Morison confesses that Jonathan Barnes taught him "how to do philosophy" and that this includes "how to drink". I can only agree. He asks: "What was Aristotle's concept of logical form?" (172-188). His answer is that "the Peripatetics did not share (one version of) the modern notion of logical form".

In order to give this answer he has to determine what this version of logical form is.  He also has to show that when Aristotle characterizes types of arguments using expressions like 'If A is predicated of all B and B of all C, then A must be predicated of all C', "the letters are not devices for indicating where expressions of a given class are to be substituted" (187). Thus the general expression of an argument is -- according to Morison -- not a formula of a formal language. His point is that Aristotle does not explain the validity of this type of argument by the meaning of some logical constant (the word 'all'), but rather by "what the premises say". We may ask, however, whether explaining what the premises say can be done without explaining what the logical constants mean. But Aristotle never tried to do this, or so Morison argues.

Susanne Bobzien's paper on higher-order vagueness and the S4 axiom (189-212) is one of the two non-historical papers in the volume. It complements her recent work on columnar higher-order vagueness. Bobzien starts with a quotation from Jonathan Barnes' Medicine, Experience and Logic (1982), which entails the principle "If it is clear that a is F, then it is clear, that it is clear that a is F", a S4-type principle that she labels (CC). Concerning this principle she aims to show three points: (1) that (CC) is perfectly compatible with higher-order vagueness; (2) that (CC) is compatible with epistemicism and its absence with contextualism and supervaluationism; (3) that recent arguments against (CC) (by Williamson) don't hold up.

To understand this we need to know what counts as higher-order vagueness. If a predicate F (like bald) is vague, it may be unclear whether or not Peter is bald. This then is a borderline case of baldness. This is first-order vagueness. It may however be unclear as well whether Peter is borderline bald or just bald. Then we have a case of borderline-borderline baldness. This is second-order vagueness. In this way we can construct any higher order of vagueness. Now the question is whether something can be a second-order borderline case of F, but not a first-order borderline case of F. Bobzien shows that the answer to this question depends on what notion of clarity we use. If we use self-revealing clarity the answer is no, if we use concealable clarity the answer is yes. The intuitions that support the latter are no more convincing than the intuitions that support the former. Next, Bobzien argues that contextualists and supervaluationists are not obliged to accept (CC), but can, for instance, incorporate margins for error into their theories; and that, by contrast, epistemicists can accept (CC), if they trade Williamson-style higher-order vagueness for columnar higher-order vagueness (i.e., higher-order vagueness in which the extensions of borderline-cases and borderline-borderline cases coincide). On this basis Bobzien is able to rebut Williamson's arguments against (CC). All this is convincing.

Ian Rumfitt's "Ramsey on truth and meaning" (213-245) is the second non-historical paper. Rumfitt starts with a very sympathetic presentation of what he calls the 'Ramsey-Prior theory of truth'. According to this theory the meaning of the predicate 'true' is to be explained by the following schema:

(T) a is true if and only if for some p, a is a . . . that p and p.

In this schema the dots have to be filled by 'belief', 'assertion', 'statement' or other words for mental states that could be bearers of truth. Accordingly, only mental states or mental acts -- not propositions -- can be bearers of truth. Rumfitt sees a lot of merit in this theory, but he also discovers that it yields a big problem. We need not only a semantic explanation of the predicate 'true', but also a semantics of propositional content. To give this, most philosophers use the so-called 'truth conditional theory of meaning' according to which an assertion is defined as something that is true if and only if what it asserts is the case (224).

Now, one sees immediately that the Ramsey-Prior theory of truth precludes this approach. For if you define 'truth' in terms of assertion and 'assertion' in terms of truth, you get a circle, and Rumfitt believes that this circle is vicious. Therefore he looks for a theory of meaning that does not make use of the concept of truth and thinks that only a pragmatist theory of content can do the job. After having criticized the proposals of Jerôme Dokic and Pascal Engel and of Blackburn (227-229), he introduces his own solution using again a suggestion of Ramsey's. According to Rumfitt, "a statement's content is determined by the possibilities it excludes". Rumfitt has in mind the possibilities for action that a rational agent might see. He calls his proposal the 'exclusionary theory of meaning and content' (230).

Let me add some critical remarks.

A statement's content does not only exclude certain possibilities of action, it also includes certain other possibilities. So, why should the content of a statement not be determined by those other possibilities as well?

Rumfitt's theory explains the better known by the less well known: his theory of content presupposes that we already know what a 'rational action' is and what a 'possibility' is. However, the semantics of these terms are much more complicated than the semantics of propositional content.

What is even more worrying is that to develop a semantics of the terms 'rational action' and 'possibility' we already need a semantic theory of propositional content. So here again a vicious circle is lurking.

To avoid the second and third problems, one must start from the most basic notion and to do so one must decide what is more basic. In my view, this must be the notion of propositional content and not the notion of truth, let alone the notions of rational action or possibility.

Ethics and Politics

The third section opens with Stephen Everson's "Justice and just action in Plato's Republic" (249-276). Everson tries to find out what Plato's definition of 'just action' must have been, given that Plato proposes an 'agent-centered' theory of justice. He criticizes Julia Annas, who argued that 'just action' should be defined as 'the action a wise man would have done in the circumstances'. On the basis of Republic 443c-444a, Everson argues that it should rather be defined as 'the action that promotes inner harmony'. However -- as he recognizes himself (252) -- this difference is not so important. For, the wise man would certainly act in such a way that his inner harmony is preserved. Everson argues that according to Annas' proposal anything a wise man does, including, e.g., taking breakfast, would count as a just action, while according to the common or vulgar concept of justice, only actions that affect other people can possibly be just or unjust. However, one may doubt that Plato would be worried by this objection.

In the case of Anthony Kenny's paper, "Practical truth in Aristotle" (277-301), it is the teacher who honours the student. Anthony Kenny remembers an essay on 'Practical Truth' written in 1965 by Jonathan Barnes who was then in his final year of Literae Humaniores. Barnes's point was that there isn't such a thing as practical truth in Aristotle. Kenny tells us that he considered Barnes's essay "one of the best (he) ever encountered in a dozen years" and that he asked him if he could keep it (277). Unfortunately Kenny cannot find Barnes's text among his papers any more. So his contribution could be considered as a tentative reconstruction of the arguments Barnes might have used.

To rebut the thesis that Aristotle has a concept of practical truth it would be sufficient to show that there is no suitable bearer of this kind of truth in Aristotle. In fact, Kenny mentions that the defenders of practical truth propose different possible bearers: Anscombe proposes  action, Lear person, and Broadie/Rowe mind. But Kenny doesn't directly attack these proposals. Instead he investigates whether prohairesis (decision) is -- according to Aristotle -- a bearer of practical truth and, not surprisingly, comes to the conclusion that it is not (280).

If prohairesis isn't true or false, it could still be Aristotle's teaching that the action that results from it is true or false. A direct way to justify this would be starting from a famous passage of De motu (701 a22-23) where Aristotle explicitly says that the conclusion of the practical syllogism is -- not a sentence or utterance that orders or recommends an action -- but the action itself. Whether this should be taken literally is the object of a large debate in the literature. However this may be, it is clear that if this were actually Aristotle's teaching (something I doubt) one could argue that -- given that the premises of a practical syllogism are true or false -- the conclusion, i.e. the action, must be true or false as well. Oddly enough, Kenny doesn't even mention this argument, though he discusses at length Aristotle's concept of the practical syllogism.

Instead of using one of Aristotle's numerous examples, Kenny (282) invents an example for this kind of syllogism -- which by the way is logically incorrect -- and tells the surprised reader that the conclusion of this syllogism is a prohairesis in the form of an utterance. He emphasizes that this utterance "is to be evaluated as good or bad, not as true or false". Thus we get a syllogism the premises of which have the values 'true' or 'false', while the conclusion has the values 'good' or 'bad'. Given that in a normal valid syllogism the truth of the premises is transferred to the conclusion, Kenny's conception is rather strange both from a logical and from a semantic point of view.

Further on in his paper (283) Kenny corrects this. Now we get the idea that the premises and the conclusion of a practical syllogism each have two different sets of values, 'true' and 'false' on the one hand and 'good' and 'bad' on the other. This is again very peculiar, and I doubt that we could introduce a logic for such hybrid syllogisms. However this may be, the question is whether this conception is to be found in Aristotle. Does Aristotle ever introduce 'good' and 'bad' as values or metalinguistic predicates of validity for practical sentences?

Kenny rightly thinks that Aristotle hoped to set rules of practical reasoning that "would turn out to have a close resemblance to his theoretical syllogistic" (283). He thinks that this hope was empty because of the defeasibility of practical reasoning. By 'defeasibility' Kenny means that we can invalidate the conclusion of a valid practical syllogism just by adding new premises to the given set of premises, and he thinks that for this reason not only Aristotle but also "every subsequent logician" was prevented from presenting a satisfactory formulation of practical inference. I think things are the other way around: a satisfactory formulation of practical inference will show that -- as in the case of theoretical inference -- there is no such thing as defeasibility. A number of logicians are currently working on such a logic and chances are that they will be successful. I agree with Kenny's final remark that Barnes was right against Anscombe. I doubt, however, that the arguments Kenny puts forward could ever have been Barnes's. Nevertheless I love the story about Barnes's early paper. I could tell a similar story about a text Susanne Bobzien handed in when she was a student of mine.

In his paper "Aristotle and the democratization of politics" (285-301), Malcolm Schofield argues that Aristotle's pioneering achievement was to define what makes the political sphere political (285). He sees two points that are the key to that achievement: (1) the definition of the citizen as a ruler; (2) the argument that a deliberating assembly is wiser than its individual parts. No doubt, he is right. One point is, however, missing in Schofield's penetrating analysis. Aristotle does not only argue that a city where the citizens are rulers is the best possible; he also argues that to be happy human beings need to exercise the most noble capacities of their mind and that one way to do this is ruling. So the citizen must have the right to rule in order to have a happy life; and since the happiness of the city is a function of the happiness of the citizens, this is also a condition of a city's happiness. (See G. Seel "The Citizen is a Ruler", in E. Moutsopoulos and M. Protopapas (eds.), The Notion of Citizenship in Greek Philosophy, Athens 2011, 100-112.)

Richard Sorabji (302-309) -- in what he calls a 'footnote on its logic' -- offers a new formula to express the Stoic technique of adding a reservation to wants and expectations. The Stoics introduced this technique not only in order to prevent disappointments, but first of all to prevent a conflict between the obligation to choose what is preferable according to nature and the obligation to accept fate and thus to avoid incompatible intentions. Sorabji looks for a correct, unambiguous formula that could -- if possible -- be expressed in Stoic logic. Sorabji's rather complicated formula is (306):

I judge for preference (either implicature, or malista men, or explicit clause) that it is appropriate that I should be well, and that it is good that God's will be done. But on the other hand, if I am not well (and I may not be well, so that the combination is impossible -- either implicature, or explicit), I judge that it is good that God's will be done.

Sorabji discusses earlier attempts to give such a formula, his own and those by Inwood, Brunschwig and Brennan, and finds them inadequate. He rightly praises Brunschwig for distinguishing the technique of reservation and the technique of reversal (of preference), but he criticizes the formula given because it does not "capture any preference" (305). This is correct. However, Sorabji's new formula does not capture every important feature of Stoic reservation and reversion either. It does not capture the epistemic dimension.

I do not want to cut a long and very complicated debate short. I mention, though, that the following two formulae may fully achieve the task Sorabji sets out:

I. Reservation: I know that according to nature being in good health is preferable to being ill, but I do not know whether it is fated for me to be in good health or to be ill. Therefore I desire (choose) to be in good health.

II. Reversion: I know that according to nature being in good health is preferable to being ill, but I also know that it is fated for me to be ill. Therefore I desire (choose) to be ill.

I think that these two formulae correspond perfectly to Chrysippus' statement as reported in Epictetus (Discourses, 2.6. 9-10) -- quoted by Sorabji as text nr.6 (308). Chrysippus says:

So long as what will follow is unclear to me, I always stick to those things that are naturally better equipped to reach the ends set by nature. For God himself has made me a choice maker concerning these things. But if I knew that now it is fated for me to be ill, I would even have an impulse for illness (My translation differs from the one given by Sorabji).

My formulae are applications of the following general rules:

I. (Rule of reservation): For all indifferent states of affairs x and all rational animals y: If y knows that x is preferable to non-x according to nature and y does not know whether fate will or will not prevent x from occurring, it should be the case that y desires (chooses) x.

II. (Rule of reversion): For all indifferent states of affairs x and all rational animals y: If y knows that x is preferable to non-x according to nature and that fate will prevent x from occurring, it should be the case that y desires (chooses) non-x.

Miriam Griffin's (310-327) purpose is to resolve three puzzles concerning Cicero's de officiis: (1)Why is the scope of the duties Cicero deals with so narrow? (2) Why did Cicero rely on Panaetius and not, say, on Hecato? (3) What is the aim of Cicero's treatise? She argues -- with Gabba -- that de officiis has to be considered as Cicero's "spiritual and political testament" (325) and that this explains why it treats mostly the duties of a politician, neglecting the duties we have to mankind. The choice of Panaetius is explained along the same line. Griffin argues that -- in Cicero's view -- Panaetius was mostly concerned with men in public life. After reading her convincing paper one might ask oneself perhaps, why these questions puzzled Griffin in the first place.

Maddalena Bonelli closes the volume with a very helpful Bibliography (331-345) of Jonathan Barnes's academic publications. There is also an Index Locorum and an Index of Names.